Cognition through Understanding: Self-Knowledge, Interlocution, Reasoning, Reflection: Philosophical Essays, Volume 3

Placeholder book cover

Tyler Burge, Cognition through Understanding: Self-Knowledge, Interlocution, Reasoning, Reflection: Philosophical Essays, Volume 3, Oxford University Press, 2013, 635pp., $45.00 (pbk.), ISBN 9780199672035.


Reviewed by Endre Begby, Simon Fraser University


This is the third volume of Tyler Burge's philosophical papers, following Truth, Thought, Reason (2005), which collected his essays on Frege, and Foundations of Mind (2007), which drew together some of Burge's most influential papers in philosophy of mind and language. With each volume running 400-600 pages, the three together would already make a sizeable lifetime contribution, and certainly so set alongside his monumental 2010 monograph Origins of Objectivity. But such is Burge's current rate of productivity that Oxford University Press is now projecting at least one more volume to follow this one, with contents yet to be determined.

This volume focuses on epistemology, and brings together essays written in the last 25 years (the short "Reasoning about Reasoning" from 1979 being the one exception), including established classics such as "Individualism and Self-Knowledge" (1988), "Content Preservation" (1993), and "Reason and the First Person" (1998), as well as newer material such as his 2007 John Dewey lectures "Self and Self-Understanding" (published 2011), whose full impact on the field is yet to be felt. Following the example set by the previous two volumes in the series, Burge provides a lengthy and exceptionally helpful introduction in which he stage-sets the essays and draws crucial connections between them, spelling out unifying assumptions and implications that emerge from the whole but that may not be evident in any one article. Additionally, one essay -- "Content Preservation" -- receives a critical and exploratory postscript, longer than the original essay itself. Together, it forms a superb package, stacked to the chimney with subtle and challenging ideas and arguments. Never easy, indeed occasionally bordering on the impenetrable,[1] the book is nonetheless essential reading for anyone with an interest in the current state of analytic philosophy.

It is impossible to cover the full sweep of these essays in a review such as this. Instead, I will attempt to give a flavor of the whole by pointing out some of the main themes that emerge in the collection and showing how they are implemented in key arguments.

* * *

Epistemology remains, of course, one of the key focus areas in contemporary philosophy. Yet what is perhaps most immediately striking about this collection is how different Burge's approach is from what is on display in most mainstream discussions. For instance, Burge offers no generic account of what knowledge is; nor does he take any stance on the question of whether knowledge is a primitive concept or permits some kind of analytic reduction (the influential work of Timothy Williamson, for instance, is not referenced at all). Other central topics in recent epistemology, such as whether "knows" is context-sensitive or whether knowledge-how is reducible to knowledge-that also receive no direct treatment. Most tellingly, perhaps, Gettier-problems are mentioned in passing only a handful of times.

Contrasted with these broad-stroke discussions pertaining to the nature of knowledge as such, Burge's investigations are bound to seem quite narrow at first glance, focusing only on the relatively esoteric set of topics listed in the work's subtitle, Self-Knowledge, Interlocution, Reasoning, Reflection. But Burge's agenda is significantly more ambitious than this list of topics might appear to suggest. For while these topics certainly do merit attention in their own right, Burge is driven in large part by the hunch that these forms of cognition are, "either in themselves or in significant respects, distinctive of persons, and (on earth) of human beings" (1). Ultimately, then, Burge's approach to epistemology is shaped by interests in the philosophy of mind and psychology. More ambitiously still, it is driven by the aim of developing an account of those most elusive philosophical concepts, self and person.[2] Self-knowledge, interlocution, reasoning, and reflection serve as focal points for Burge's investigations because they are all in part manifestations of distinctive human cognitive capacities that "constitutively make selves -- and persons -- the beings that they are" (ix).

In another striking, though certainly not unrelated development, Burge argues that due recognition of the role that these sources of knowledge play in our overall cognitive economy provides a (partial) vindication of the rationalist tradition in philosophy. The vital clue is that all these forms of cognition involve distinctive and important forms of a priori epistemic warrant. However, Burge is a far cry from the rationalist caricature so widely derided in 20th century philosophy. He does not contend that all knowledge rests on a priori foundations, nor that a priori knowledge, where available, is better, or more secure, or more perspicuous, than counterparts obtained through the senses. Note, specifically, how Burge consistently speaks of a priori warrants for belief rather than a priori truths or even a priori knowledge. Burge is careful to point out that many beliefs supported by a priori warrants are fallible and can be rationally doubted. Many are liable to be overturned by empirical evidence.

In Burge's hands, then, the distinction between a priori and empirical warrant turns simply on the question of the source of epistemic support: to the extent that a belief is supported by sensory inputs, it has empirical warrant; to the extent that it is supported by reflection or the exercise of understanding, it has a priori warrant. To my mind, Burge is at his best when he shows how a priori and empirical sources of epistemic warrant co-exist and intertwine in our everyday exercise of cognitive agency. Many of our beliefs are supported, to some degree or other, in both ways, and are, to this extent, overdetermined with respect to their epistemic character. These are welcome and timely emendations to the rationalist tradition: even such a limited vindication of the role of the a priori will serve to counteract broad tendencies in contemporary philosophy, and point us toward a more complex picture of the human mind and its capacities. In the end, it is no small irony that Burge aligns himself with the rationalist tradition precisely in part to combat what he sees as the overly intellectualistic tendencies of the predominantly empiricist 20th century philosophy. These tendencies are intellectualistic (indeed "hyper-intellectualistic") insofar as they demand that subjects be in a position to offer reasons or evidence for their beliefs in order to claim knowledge. This view has as a consequence (explicitly endorsed by some, reluctantly conceded by others) that young children and higher non-human animals cannot be said to know anything, insofar as they lack the sophisticated intellectual abilities required for the concept of knowledge to apply.[3]

* * *

If there is a single philosophical move that clears the ground for most of the arguments in these papers, it is arguably the distinction that Burge draws between two species of epistemic warrant: entitlement and justification. Justification has provided the focal point of most epistemological theorizing in the philosophical tradition: it is the epistemic status that a subject may enjoy when she can cite (good) reasons for holding a particular belief. But as Burge argues, subjects need not be able to cite reasons for their beliefs in order nonetheless to enjoy a positive epistemic status (indeed, as he repeatedly emphasizes, they need not even be in possession of concepts such as proof, evidence, and reason). Instead, they can be entitled to their beliefs simply in virtue of exercising well-functioning cognitive mechanisms -- be it perception, memory, reflection, or speech comprehension.

The distinction between entitlement and justification performs yeoman service in Burge's bid to counteract the intellectualistic tendencies of contemporary epistemology. The distinction allows him to bridge the epistemologies of animal and early childhood cognition with the more familiar concerns of mainstream epistemology in an illuminating and empirically plausible way.[4] Children and animals can enjoy positive epistemic status despite not even having the cognitive and conceptual capacities required to obtain justification. Meanwhile, Burge believes, it would be a mistake to assume that since mature human beings possess such capacities, justification is always the appropriate epistemic category to deploy in their case. To the contrary, Burge argues that large and important domains of even mature human cognition is better treated in terms of entitlement than in terms of justification.

This very general line of reasoning is put to extremely effective use in a number of the essays included in this volume: to argue for a distinctive and robust kind of self-knowledge (e.g., "Our Entitlement to Self-Knowledge"), for our reliance on a certain kind of memory (e.g., "Memory and Self-Knowledge"), for our reliance on testimony (e.g., "Content Preservation"), for comprehending speech (e.g., "Comprehension and Interpretation"), and for our belief in the existence of other minds (e.g., "A Warrant for Belief in Other Minds"). In all these cases, we can possess an immediate and unreflective entitlement to our beliefs without having to cite reasons for the veracity of the beliefs or to argue for the reliability of the mechanisms that produce them. These are capacities and resources that human beings can draw on long before they get to the point where they can critically assess evidence in the way that the epistemic category of justification would require of them. Indeed, they are capacities and resources without which the development of such a critical epistemic perspective would arguably not even be possible in the first place.

These claims are supported by detailed examples and arguments, many of which must surely count among the finest and most probing pieces of philosophical writing to have emerged in the last decades. I believe the general direction they point in is indisputably correct. More controversial, perhaps, is Burge's claim -- crucial to the overall aim of the collection -- that the form of epistemic warrant on display in all these cases also involves a substantive a priori element.

* * *

The role of apriority in Burge's thinking is perhaps best seen in the range of essays that concern, in one form or another, the topic of self-knowledge. Burge was brought to consider the issue through a common objection to anti-individualism: according to anti-individualism,[5] individuation conditions for thoughts must make reference to the individual's physical and social context. To follow a well-worn example, anti-individualists hold that whether a subject is thinking a thought about water or about twater depends not simply on "what's in the head," but also on relations to the environment in which his thoughts are formed, viz. Earth or Twin Earth. Suppose, then, that an individual undergoes an environmental switch, for instance by being moved unawares from Earth to Twin Earth. Anti-individualism appears to predict that once the appropriate causal connections are established in the subject's new environment, the contents of his thoughts will change accordingly. But if the subject remains ignorant of the environmental switch, and never gives a moment's thought to the possibility that he is in fact living out his days on Twin Earth, it appears plausible that he would, in a sense, fail to know what he is thinking on occasion: specifically, he might mistakenly believe that he is tokening thoughts about water when in fact he is tokening thoughts about twater.[6] More generally, since the subject could evidently only determine which thought he is tokening by conducting an empirical investigation of his environment, it would seem that anti-individualism is incompatible with the view that we can ever have a priori knowledge of our own thoughts (a.k.a. "privileged access").[7]

Burge addresses this problem in terms of the question of whether environmental switches introduce the possibility of "brute errors" in self-ascriptions of thoughts (see, e.g., "Individualism and Self-Knowledge," 62). Brute errors are errors that do not indicate epistemic culpability or malfunction on the subject's part. Such errors are commonly observed in perception: shrewdly place a mirror in front of my gaze, and I will form the belief that the apple on the table is in front of me rather than behind me. This is a false belief, but nevertheless one that is formed as a result of the competent (perhaps even optimal) exercise of my perceptual faculties. Accordingly, the error does not indicate epistemic culpability or malfunction on my part.

It is easy to see how one might think that these environmental switches introduce similar room for brute error in the self-ascriptions of thoughts, and so, in self-knowledge. The subject cannot be faulted for failing to know about the environmental switch. When he self-ascribes a thought, such as "I hereby believe that water slakes thirst," he appears to get the content wrong, though by no fault of his own. And so, the mistaken self-ascription would appear to be an instance of brute error.

Burge denies this conclusion and the line of reasoning that supports it. In self-ascriptions of thoughts, the first-order content -- water slakes thirst -- gets redeployed in the second-order judgment -- I hereby believe that water slakes thirst. Thus, whichever environmental factors determine the identity of the relevant concepts in our first-order thoughts also determine their identity as they are redeployed in the second-order self-ascriptions. If this is correct, then we have no occasion to worry that the subject's first-order thought might instantiate the concept twater while his second-order level self-ascription instantiates the concept water. There is simply no room for the kind of slippage between the two levels of thought that would introduce the possibility of brute errors in self-ascription. Burge writes: "by its reflexive, self-referential character, the content of the second-order judgment is logically locked (self-referentially) onto the first-order content which it both contains and takes as its subject matter" ("Individualism and Self-Knowledge," 64). Meanwhile, it remains true, of course, that the subject may not know which environment he is located in, Earth or Twin Earth. But what eludes him here is perfectly plain empirical knowledge, not knowledge of his own thoughts.

If we persist in arguing that this scenario raises a problem for self-knowledge, then we are operating with the wrong category of epistemic warrant: maybe there remains a sense in which a full-fledged justification for his self-ascription would require an empirical investigation of the environment. But the subject can nonetheless be epistemically entitled to his self-ascription, simply in virtue of having exercised his cognitive capacities correctly. Further, it would seem that the warrant in question is a priori, in the way that the objection requires. It is, of course, not a priori in the sense of being delivered by some mysterious non-perceptual faculty of inner observation -- that would be an entirely misguided approach to the matter. Rather, it is a priori simply in virtue of the fact that it is evidently unaffected by the kinds of environmental switches that are detailed in the objection. Finally, Burge argues that in one central range of such cases -- self-ascriptions of occurrent thoughts -- the a priori warrant actually secures infallible knowledge. With a nod to Descartes, Burge calls such self-ascriptions "cogito-thoughts" (e.g., "Our Entitlement to Self-Knowledge," 72). Such thoughts play an important role in the edifice of Burgean neo-rationalism: they are, for instance, the subject of extensive investigation in the third and final lecture of "Self and Self-Understanding."

* * *

Having worked out the distinction between entitlement and justification in the context of self-knowledge, Burge then sets out -- in papers such as "Content Preservation," "Interlocution, Perception, and Memory," "Computer Proof, A priori Knowledge, and Other Minds," and "Comprehension and Interpretation" -- to deploy it in constructive ways towards resolving a number of epistemological problems. In all of these applications, Burge claims to find a distinctively a priori element at work in the exercise of the cognitive capacities that underwrite the epistemic entitlement.

Part of the reasoning behind this claim is deceptively straightforward, instantiating the familiar disjunctive syllogism. As Burge puts it: "a type of cognition is non-empirical, or apriori, if one's warrant for the cognition -- one's right to rely on it as cognition -- does not derive from sense experience" (2). Accordingly, epistemic warrant derives either from sensory experience or it does not. But the epistemic status enjoyed in these cases does not in any clear sense derive from empirical sources. If so, it must be non-empirical, which is just to say that it is a priori. It is vitally important to be clear on what is and is not claimed by this conclusion. For in another distinctive move that reoccurs in many of these essays, Burge acknowledges that the warrant would not obtain unless certain empirical matters of fact also obtained -- such as the proper functioning of the relevant cognitive apparatus. But he insists that these matters of fact do not, in their own right, contribute to the subject's epistemic standing. Assertions to the effect that these matters of fact obtain in the case at hand do not, for instance, figure as premises in an inference supporting the belief: that would already take us into the province of justification, not entitlement. Instead, "warrant can be apriori . . . even if sense experience is necessary for the acquisition of the understanding involved in the warranted cognitive abilities" ("Comprehension and Interpretation," 351-52). In short, empirical matters of fact can figure in the causal chain that enables us possess these epistemic warrants, but without contributing to the warrant itself.

In many of Burge's examples, this line of reasoning holds considerable promise and may well bear out. It remains an open question, though, how far it generalizes. Perhaps a more prudent conclusion to draw from these examples would be that the distinction between a priori and a posteriori warrant is just too crude to provide a plausible classification of some of the more complex cases. Interestingly, one new Postscript written specifically for this volume seems to suggest that Burge may well be coming around to this conclusion himself. In "Content Preservation," Burge argued that a subject may well come to enjoy a priori knowledge by interlocution. Testimonial belief acquisition, Burge argues, is governed by the Acceptance Principle: "A person is entitled to accept as true something that is presented as true and that is intelligible to him, unless there are stronger reasons not to do so" ("Content Preservation," 237). The Acceptance Principle is a priori, according to Burge: specifically, it does not derive from empirical assumptions about the preponderance of truth over falsity in interlocution.[8] But it is important to note that subjects do not (ordinarily) use the Acceptance Principle as a premise in an inference that issues in a justification for accepting as true what an interlocutor tells them. Instead, we "instinctively" form beliefs in accordance with the Acceptance Principle; in the absence of countervailing reasons, we are entitled to do so without further justification. The Acceptance Principle is an articulation, for philosophical purposes, of the content of this entitlement; philosophers can seek further justification of the principle by reflecting on conceptual connections between rationality, interlocution, and truth. But none of these things need play a role in the psychology of the subject who is confronted with testimony.

With this in mind, suppose that a source has a priori knowledge that p, and tells the subject. By competent exercise of her faculties of language comprehension, she comes to acquire the belief that p. Her belief is warranted. If p is true, it constitutes knowledge. What, more specifically, should we say about the character of the warrant? Burge reasons as follows: it is true that the subject only comes to acquire the knowledge by way of the senses, i.e., by hearing speech or reading written language. But the fact that sensory intermediaries were causally involved in the acquisition does nothing to show that the knowledge thereby acquired is a posteriori.

So far, this seems right. But does this support the conclusion that the knowledge is a priori? In "Content Preservation," Burge argued so, drawing on analogies with the role of memory in supporting a range of cognitive operations and with the role of diagrams in triggering geometrical understanding. To start with the latter, it may well be a fact about human psychology that we could not come to cognize certain geometrical truths without the aid of diagrams. Nonetheless, the fact that visual aids are causally involved in bringing about the relevant kind of understanding does not entail that the understanding -- and the epistemic warrant that attaches to it -- is a posteriori. To the contrary, such knowledge is plainly a priori.

The analogy with memory is perhaps more illuminating. Memory, Burge argues, preserves content -- and its epistemic status -- for subsequent use in cognition.[9] The fact that an essentially empirical state of affairs -- the reliability of memory -- is vital to such operations does nothing to show that the resultant epistemic status is a posteriori. If the knowledge was a priori upon acquisition, it remains a priori when delivered to current use by memory. Where memory preserves content and epistemic force within a person across times, interlocution preserves content and epistemic force across persons. Thus, if the testifier's knowledge was a priori, the recipient's knowledge can be a priori as well. It may well be that the mechanism of content preservation operant in interlocution -- involving as it does the comprehension of written or spoken language -- is less reliable, hostage to a greater degree of contingency, than the intrapersonal mechanism of content preservation -- memory. But if it is reliable, as we have good reason to assume that it is, then the same lesson holds. A priori knowledge can be preserved and delivered by testimony no less than by memory. The fact that external senses are involved in the former case but not in the latter makes no difference to the epistemic status of the product. Burge writes:

People who depend on interlocution for knowledge of mathematical theorems but do not know the proofs can have apriori knowledge in this sense. The source mathematician knows the theorem apriori and the recipient is entitled apriori to accept the word of the source, in the absence of reasons to doubt. Most of us knew the Pythagorean theorem at some stage in this manner. When apriori knowledge is preserved through reports which the recipient is apriori justified in accepting, the receiver's knowledge is apriori. ("Content Preservation," 251-2)

In the Postscript written for this volume, Burge admits that he now doubts this line of reasoning. Or more precisely, he admits that he "was never comfortable with" the conclusion, and always recognized that it violated common sense:

The view is clearly counter-intuitive. At first, I thought that some illumination might be gained by developing the position in an exploratory spirit. Then when I failed to see what was wrong with it, and when objections repeatedly seemed not to show it wrong . . . I went with it" ("Postscript to 'Content Preservation'," 282).

Where he now sees himself as having made a mistake is in underestimating the epistemic significance of the communicative event itself, and thereby overestimating the analogy with preservative memory and diagrams in geometry. Quite simply, the empirical fact that a certain proposition was uttered does contribute to the epistemic warrant that entitles us to form beliefs on the basis of testimony ("Postscript to 'Content Preservation'," 282). This point stands independently of whether one believes, as does Burge, that most or much of what is communicated in a communicative event can be retrieved by way of the "immediate, unreasoned, and non-inferential" exercise of one's standing linguistic abilities ("Comprehension and Interpretation," 350) or whether it requires rich supplementation by inferential processing, as has been argued, for instance, by Anne Bezuidenhout (1998), drawing on Dan Sperber and Deirdre Wilson (1986). No matter how the content is retrieved, the bare fact that a communicative event took place in which some content was presented as true must play some role in the subject's warrant for acquiring belief by testimony.[10] And this fact is presumably something that could only be ascertained through sensory experience.

Thus, Burge now acknowledges that there is always an empirical warrant attaching to testimonial knowledge. Nonetheless, he continues to hold, in the spirit of his earlier arguments, that the significance of this empirical warrant may vary with each case, and that in many cases, it will not be particularly central at all ("Postscript to 'Content Preservation'," 284). This seems correct: what it does, it seems to me, is to underscore the important point that in many of the cases that Burge brings to light, our cognition is supported simultaneously by an intricate mix of empirical and rational resources. Any attempt to determine further whether a particular belief and its epistemic status is a priori or a posteriori is futile and beside the point.

* * *

Nonetheless, and even as tempered in these ways, Burge's neo-rationalist program constitutes a distinctive and powerful approach to epistemology and philosophical psychology: there is a capacity of the human mind, called understanding, whose exercise is a source of a priori warrant. The operations of understanding are evident in a wide range of cases, including self-knowledge, interlocution, reasoning, and reflection. The fact that these operations rarely stand on their own, and that their epistemic contributions are often crowded out by those of the senses, does not mean that we as philosophers and budding cognitive scientists should not have an interest in studying them in their own right. Recent years have seen a number of efforts to rehabilitate the role of the a priori in epistemology and in philosophy at large.[11] Burge's contributions are of particular note in that they attempt to do so in a way that renders the a priori relevant to the empirical study of human and animal cognition.[12]

Begby, Endre. "Review of Tyler Burge, Origins of Objectivity." Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, February 2011.

Bezuidenhout, Anne. 1998. "Is Verbal Communication a Purely Preservative Process?" Philosophical Review 107(2): 261-288.

Boghossian, Paul. 1989. "Content and Self-Knowledge." Philosophical Topics, 17(1): 5-26.

Boghossian, Paul, and Christopher Peacocke, eds. 2000. New Essays on the A Priori. Oxford University Press.

Brown, Jessica. 1995. "The Incompatibility of Anti-Individualism and Privileged Access." Analysis 55(3): 149-156.

Burge, Tyler, 1979. "Individualism and the Mental." Midwest Studies in Philosophy 4(1): 73-121.

Burge, Tyler. 1982. "Other Bodies." In Andrew Woodfield, ed., Thought and Object, Oxford University Press.

Burge, Tyler. 2003. "Perceptual Entitlement." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67(3): 503-548.

Burge, Tyler. 2007. Foundations of Mind: Philosophical Essays, Volume 2. Oxford University Press.

Burge, Tyler. 2010. Origins of Objectivity. Oxford University Press.

Casullo, Alberto, and Joshua C. Thurow, eds. 2013. The A Priori in Philosophy. Oxford University Press.

Malmgren, Anna-Sara. 2006. "Is there A Priori Knowledge by Testimony?" Philosophical Review 115(2): 199-241.

McKinsey, Michael. 1991. "Anti-Individualism and Privileged Access." Analysis 51(1): 9-16.

McLaughlin, Brian, and Michael Tye. 1998. "Is Content-Externalism Compatible with Privileged Access?" Philosophical Review 107(3): 349-380

Putnam, Hilary. 1975. "The Meaning of 'Meaning'." Reprinted in Mind, Language, and Reality: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3, Cambridge University Press, 1975.

Sperber, Dan, and Deirdre Wilson. 1986. Relevance: Communication and Cognition. Oxford: Blackwell.

[1] I have in mind a tendency in Burge’s writings, which starts to gather pace in essays such “Our Entitlement to Self-Knowledge” and “A Century of Deflation and a Moment of Self-Knowledge,” but which is allowed to flower fully in “Self and Self-Understanding.” For instance, Burge here repeatedly makes claims to the effect that some x (e.g., selves) constitutively has some property y (e.g., being subject to a certain kind of norm). Conceivably, these claims are true. What frustrates is that Burge never offers any clarification of what the purported relation of constitutivity amounts to, so as to place the reader in a position to evaluate whether they are true. Accordingly, consider the following representative passage: “the notion of self bears complex constitutive relations to a wider physical reality. As far as I know, selves may necessarily depend on a physical body. I think, however, that there is no evident conceptual or even apriori necessity that selves have physical properties, although all selves we know of depend in some way on their bodies” (“Self and Self-Understanding,” 143). Thus, while the self’s relation to a wider physical reality is constitutive, its relation to a body is (merely?) necessary (though the connection is neither apriori nor conceptual). Evidently, these distinctions mean something to Burge, but what? How is a reader to assess such claims? On the very next page, Burge writes: “Selves are subjects with representational competencies, states, events, and acts. They are subjects with perceptual systems, capacities for inference, beliefs, intentions, perceptions, occurrent thoughts, decisions” (“Self and Self-Understanding,” 144). Out of context, I would be happy to take these claims at face value. But in light of the metaphysical language of the previous page, this becomes difficult: presumably Burge does not mean to suggest that these are simply contingent facts about selves. So are they constitutive facts about selves? Or are they merely necessary? If Burge were more explicit about his terminology and conceptual commitments, readers might be able to extrapolate from context what the modal force of each claim is, so as to make up their own minds about the matter. Meanwhile, it remains quite unclear what philosophical point even hangs on the distinction.

[2] This ambition is most evident in “Self and Self-Understanding,” but can also be seen in earlier essays such as “Our Entitlement to Self-Knowledge” and “Reason and the First Person.”

[3] This war on the “hyper-intellectualization” of epistemology was declared in Burge 2003 and followed up in great detail in Burge 2010. (For an extensive review of the latter, see Begby 2011). But the motivation for it was arguably present in Burge’s anti-individualism from the start, in the form of the claim that subjects may be in possession of concepts about which they nonetheless harbor deep confusions. On this, see Burge 1979.

[4] See, e.g., Burge 2003; 2010, as well as, from the present collection, “Self and Self-Understanding” (in particular Lectures I and II), “Content Preservation,” and “Memory and Persons.”

[5] See, e.g., Burge 1979; 1982.

[6] This objection is made possible by Burge’s radicalization of Putnam’s conclusion from “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’” (Putnam 1975). On Putnam’s view, the subject’s psychological state is the same in both the actual and the twin case: what changes is simply the meaning of his word “water.” (In standard terminology, “narrow content” stays the same across the environmental switch while “wide content” changes.) Accordingly, the subject of Putnam’s thought experiment faces no comparable dissociation from his own mental states. By contrast, Burge believes that the distinction between narrow and wide content is misguided, and that environmental changes affect psychological content and semantic content both (see, e.g., Burge 1979: 108n; Burge 2007: 12). This crucial difference between the two arguments is often overlooked as they have become assimilated under the heading of “(content) externalism” in much of the subsequent literature.

[7] For variations on this line of argument, see, e.g., Boghossian 1989, McKinsey 1991, Brown 1995, McLaughlin and Tye 1998.

[8]  Burge notes (“Content Preservation,” 252) that the Acceptance Principle is closely related to the Principle of Charity, which figures centrally in the work of Quine and Davidson. But what is the epistemic status of the Principle of Charity? In a revealing anecdote, Burge recounts an episode which he retrospectively identifies as a “landmark” in own his philosophical development: “I . . . remember, perhaps two years past graduate school, asking Quine – during a long, late-night car trip in New England – whether he thought that his principle of charity is empirically grounded. After a full minute of silence, he replied with no elaboration, ‘Perhaps it’s not’” (viii).

[9] For a more detailed account, see, e.g., “Interlocution, Perception, and Memory.”

[10] I confess I find it peculiar, and mildly distressing, that Burge presents this as though it were an entirely novel point, one that his critics over the last 20 years have altogether missed. To the contrary, the point is explored in great detail in Malmgren 2006.

[11] See, e.g., the essays collected in Boghossian and Peacocke 2000 and Casullo and Thurow 2013.

[12] Many thanks to Holly Andersen and Eliot Michaelson for feedback on an earlier draft.