Cognitive Complications: Epistemology in Pragmatic Perspective

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Nicholas Rescher, Cognitive Complications: Epistemology in Pragmatic Perspective, Lexington Books, 2015, 211pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498521802.

Reviewed by Scott F. Aikin, Vanderbilt University


This is a collection of fifteen short chapters by Nicholas Rescher on a variety of issues in epistemology. Some of the chapters are stand-alone works, but many come as packages of progressive refinements of particular themes. In the Preface, Rescher writes that "The prime intent of this book is innovation," as many of the chapters' topics "address issues that are under-examined in the present state of discussion, their inherent interest notwithstanding." The broad set of undertheorized issues he surveys can be roughly described as the pragmatic questions arising in ongoing inquiry. There are questions of how to allocate intellectual resources, which questions to prioritize, how detailed the research must be, and how to manage the fact of our inherent cognitive and resource limitations. Rational inquiry is a practical affair, and though its objectives are ideal (and, in some ways, idealizations), Rescher's objective here is to remind us of the real limitations faced by finite intellects that want to know.

Rescher's style, as with many of his other works, is fluid and clear. He has an uncanny capacity to explain matters with lucidity and efficiency; this book is exemplary in this regard. The overarching aim of the book is drawing out the consequences of what Rescher calls The Law of Imperfectability: "With any practicable human arrangement in this world there is a limit to the extent that errors can be eliminated on a systematic basis." (24)

Rescher holds that this law is true on the basis of what he terms the "inexhaustibility of facts" and the "denumerability of truths" (117-8). Truths require statements, which are enumerable and so only denumerably infinite. Facts, on the other hand, are not only infinite, but are so that they are transdenumerably infinite -- "no purportedly comprehensive listing of truths can actually manage to encompass all facts" (119). The consequence, Rescher holds, is that "There is more to reality than can ever be said about it" (126).

A variety of important consequences follow from the Law of Imperfectability. The first is that, given our aspirations for completeness, error is inescapable. On the one hand, we may pursue precise and detailed theories, but these will nevertheless not only to fail to be complete (as a consequence of the inexhaustibility of fact), but as they approach the level of detail they must to avoid error, they become less theories and more mere descriptions of individual events. Technologies make progress along these lines possible, as more detailed data can be collected, stored and sorted, but in this regard, "Technological dependency sets technological limits -- first to data-acquisition and then to theory-projection" (83). On the other hand, our drive for simplicity and elegance Rescher sees as "grounded less in considerations of truth than in considerations of effective praxis -- if not introducing complications unless and until a need for them comes to light" (36). As a result, Rescher sees that all theories must, in the end, be instances of oversimplification because they must be produced at a time for particular purposes with particular notions of what is salient and what isn't. "Oversimplification is the result of omitting relevant detail" (59). In economizing cognitive processes (simplification is a face of practical rationality constraining theoretical reason) we must omit details, but we do not know which details will turn out to be significant or not since we do not know what technologies will allow us to more effectively gather and analyze data in the future.

The overall perspective that emerges Rescher calls epistemic pessimism, the view that the cognitive domestication of reality in toto is a forlorn hope (126). This is not to say that Rescher is a skeptic, but rather that he adopts a view of the limitations of human knowledge that allows us to know much but not all the things within our purview of interest. With the growth of knowledge, it turns out we find there are more and more things we do not know. The growth of knowledge occasions the growth of identifiable ignorance -- without that prior knowledge, it was simply ignorance. And a bit of good news emerges as such ignorance (once identified) yields safer judgments. Only once we recognize the bounds of what is known true can we safely speak about what we do not know in a way that allows us to devise means for inquiry into it.

On the whole, Rescher's discussions are sober yet sanguine regarding his epistemic pessimism; however, he ends the book with a jarring exercise. Instead of surveying human cognitive limitations from the inside, he does so from without. For this purpose, he does not call upon the divine or any holy host, but rather invents an alien species, "intelligent little green creatures from the planet ZONK." These alien scientists-cum-anthropologists survey the human sciences, describe our research technologies, and assess our current theoretical advancements. Rescher's chapter is written in the voice of these aliens as their report to their central scientific institution. The exercise is usefully illustrative, as the ZONK aliens, given their environment of mostly water (they, it seems, are something like psychic jellyfish), find our solid-state physics developed well past theirs. Yet they find our progress in areas in which they have done significant research lacking (areas Rescher terms psychointegration and processual hydrodynamics, precisely the kind of areas in which psychic jellyfish would excel). The objective of the alien report is to be a case in point about the management of cognitive limitation, given interest and resources: "knowledge is inevitability developed by a civilization with its own resources and from its own point of view" (195). The chapter, however illustrative, is quite jarring in its change of pace; the rest of the book had given no hint of impending science fiction.

Nicholas Rescher's Cognitive Complications is a well-written and innovatively argued articulation of the consequences of epistemic pessimism. His case for the Law of Imperfectability and the inevitability of particular errors in theory construction are convincing and provide a roadmap for the management of cognitive risk. In this regard, Rescher's work is a solid contribution to the pragmatist program of squaring our aspirations for knowledge with our practical interests. The book does have some repetition, but this is in the service of variations on a theme well worth explication.