Cognitive Disability and its Challenge to Moral Philosophy

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Eva Feder Kittay and Licia Carlson (eds.), Cognitive Disability and its Challenge to Moral Philosophy, Wiley-Blackwell, 2010, 426pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405198288.

Reviewed by Christian Perring, Dowling College


This collection of 22 papers focuses on ethical issues arising from cognitive disability. The authors are nearly all philosophers, though there are a few contributions from people in other fields. The papers are based on talks given at a 2008 conference at Stony Brook University -- the original presentations are available online -- and a very similar collection of papers was previously published as a double issue of Metaphilosophy (vol. 40, nos. 3-4, July 2009). The book shows that there has been significant philosophical discussion of these issues in the past, and the papers demonstrate it is a rich area for further discussion.

The book is divided into six main sections, roughly corresponding to the different areas of philosophy covered. Two authors address historical issues and the progress in our understanding and treatment of people with cognitive disability, particularly the growing awareness of their moral status and the problematic nature of older ways of treating them. Four authors address how theories of justice can accommodate people with cognitive disabilities. Three papers examine moral relationships between caregivers and people with cognitive disabilities, and another four address what might loosely be called the discourse of cognitive disability. Two sections address more metaphysical questions: one on agency and another on personhood. The quality of papers is strong, and this collection will be of lasting importance in a variety of subfields of philosophy, as well as in the overlapping fields of medical ethics and disability studies.

Jeffrey Brosco, a historian of medicine, gives a survey of policy and practice in preventing intellectual disability. He focuses mainly on the second half of twentieth-century America with its growing understanding of the causes of the conditions that lead to cognitive disability.  That understanding resulted in systematic efforts to reduce the incidence of those conditions: malnutrition, inadequate housing, toxin exposure, poverty and hunger. Brosco argues that the evidence suggests it is more effective to reduce poverty and hunger than to make specific medical interventions.

Psychiatrist James Harris gives a brief overview of the current scientific understanding of intellectual impairment, with some attention to how it is defined, the words used as labels, and the kinds of tests performed to measure the level of disability. He surveys not only intelligence, but also the development of empathy, affectivity, and understanding of social rules. Harris argues that it is the capacity for moral behavior rather than reasoning in solving moral dilemmas that is relevant to the moral personhood of those with intellectual disability. It is tempting to interpret him as arguing for a Humean rather than a Kantian conception of moral capacity in discussing people with cognitive disability, but he does not express his view in those terms, and it is not clear how well his definitions mesh with those in the philosophical literature. Harris is clear, however, that we need to be careful in giving some people with cognitive disabilities full control of their lives. He gives two examples of syndromes associated with behavior that leads to self-harm, one due to self-injury and one due to overeating. While he does not say that we need to restrain people who may not act in their own best interests, he is cautious about how we should respect their rights. When it comes to medical research, his discussion indicates that the protocol regarding informed consent is similar for both children and people with cognitive disability. Even if legal guardians consent to treatment, it is still necessary to get informed consent from the individuals involved in the experiment when possible. Harris's main thrust of argument is that we should not underestimate the distinctive human capacities of those with intellectual impairments. The papers by Brosco and Harris, both non-philosophers, provide valuable information, but they do not engage with moral philosophy as such, and so stand apart from the rest of the collection.

One major concern about social contract theories of distributive justice is that they have difficulties recognizing rights for those who do not have the capacity to rationally agree to a contract. Historically, social contract theorists have not made those with diminished powers of reasoning equal partners in society, and there has been a vigorous discussion whether Rawls's theory can be successfully interpreted as including those with cognitive disabilities. In a parallel way, those who have rejected a medical or individual model of disability and instead argue that disability is a social condition (for example, Oliver 1983) have difficulty including people with cognitive disabilities in their analysis, since no matter what accommodations were made for them, they would still not be able to fully participate in rational discussion.

Martha Nussbaum has pursued this accusation against Rawls. Her contribution briefly summarizes her argument and then offers her own theory of justice, based on the idea that there is a list of basic "capabilities" all humans should have access to in order to have human dignity. She briefly discusses the right, on her theory, of people with cognitive disabilities to education. She argues that her approach is in line with the ideals behind the current US educational policy in the Individuals with Disabilities Education Act, although she has criticisms for the ways that act has been implemented. Her more revisionist suggestions come when she looks at voting rights and jury service. She distinguishes three kinds of cases: people whose disabilities are not severe enough to prevent them from being capable of making judgments about criminal responsibility and political parties, but who may need some accommodation in voting or serving on a jury; people whose needs are greater and would need to communicate their preferences to a guardian; and people who are unable to perform the function in question because they are unable to even form a view. Nussbaum argues that the first two groups are entitled to participate with whatever help is required and if necessary a guardian should be involved. Then she turns to the third case and makes her most radical proposal, that guardians or surrogates for people who are unable to reason for themselves due to cognitive deficits should both vote and serve on juries to represent the interests of the person with disability. She acknowledges that this is a long way from actually happening in the USA, but she still argues in favor of the principle.

Michael Bérubé is enthusiastic about the use of guardians for those with cognitive disabilities who are unable to function alone, and he criticizes the disability studies movement for not embracing the idea. He argues they have overemphasized the idea that each disabled person can speak for herself. He points out that while his own son Jamie, who has Down syndrome, is able to speak for himself, some of his requests are unreasonable, and as Jamie's guardian, he declines them. He goes further and expresses doubts about Jamie's ability to attend to the proceedings of a trial and make a good judgment of guilt or innocence. Thus he concludes that he has doubts whether the right to vote and the right to serve on a jury should be put on an equal footing in a theory of justice.

Both Cynthia Stark and Sophia Isako Wong disagree with Nussbaum that we have to reject a Rawlsian approach if we are to include people with cognitive disability in the social contract. Their approaches are different, and both require familiarity with some of the finer details of Rawls's arguments. Both make their arguments extremely clear, so it will be possible for other scholars to isolate points of agreement and disagreement.

Although it is in a different section of the book, labeled "Care," Jonathan Wolff's article on cognitive disability and social equality seems to be addressing similar issues about justice. In contrast to the articles of Stark and Wong, his is not tied to the ideas of Rawls, but rather is a more general examination of public policy and its philosophical underpinnings. It raises a number of interesting points, but his main argument is in favor of people with cognitive disabilities being able to decide for themselves how they spend money they are given by supporting institutions to help them with their disabilities. It requires the context of Wolff's other work on disability to see the importance of this issue to moral philosophy.

A few of the papers in the collection address not developmental cognitive disabilities but dementia acquired later in life. Hilde Lindemann discusses how to care for a person as her identity unravels with loss of memory and personality. She emphasizes the idea of "holding" as a kind of care which involves a maintaining of identity through telling stories. With children, good holding in a family involves telling stories and keeping up practices that maintain their identity and growth. The difficulty is in knowing how to hold someone whose identity is fading. An older person's identity may consist in caring for others, and so letting him do something like that is also a way of holding him, even if the person with dementia is holding in an extremely fragmented way. Lindemann's remarks here are suggestive, but they need a wider framework for support. She makes a number of claims about the value of holding that rely purely on intuition, and some people may suspect that it is just sentimentality to focus on keeping a person with severe dementia in a position to care clumsily. In order to make progress on such a disagreement, the discussion would need to find more reasons for or against these intuitions.

Bruce Jennings argues for similar conclusions, specifically that the appropriate aims of care for people with moderate or severe dementia should be "the preservation and restoration of capacities for human communicative relations and an honoring of the identity of the person with dementia" (p. 174). He rejects the dominant view that care should be directed at meeting immediate experiential needs. Jennings advocates the curious idea of memorial personhood: on this view, careers should assess their approach not (only?) on the basis of the person's current abilities, but the basis of the imagination and memory of others. One wonders whether this would apply also to the treatment of patients in permanent comas. Jennings makes a plausible case that this conception of the quality of life should at least be considered as an alternative to hedonic conceptions, but the link between an ethic of flourishing and the need to honor memorial identity is not as transparent as he assumes. One concern about care that emphasizes memorial identity is that it may be more for the benefit of family members than for the person with dementia.

In the section on agency, Daniel Wikler's paper, part of which appeared in 1979, explores the case for paternalistic decisions regarding people with mild cognitive disabilities. He maintains that we need to balance individual rights and social welfare. James Lindemann Nelson attempts to show that theories about the extended mind are relevant to debates on proxy decision making on behalf of demented people. He brings the view of extended mentation of Andy Clark and David Chalmers to bear on the question of how we should react when a demented person's values are significantly different from those of her former self. Nelson's argument is that if we put our values down in writing before we become demented, and those writings are part of our extended mind, then they are still part of our mind after we become demented, and so our values have not completely changed. When demented, we have two sets of conflicting values, one in our brain, and the other written down. It is a strange and counterintuitive argument.

Leslie Francis and Anita Silvers take on issues of justice raised by Rawls and Nussbaum, addressing the status of people with cognitive disabilities in liberal theory. They try to avoid metaphysical philosophy in their paper, although they are aware their arguments have a metaphysical appearance. They argue that trustees can help people with cognitive disabilities be full members of a liberal state, comparing trustees to a prosthetic device that aids the disabled person's thinking. Theirs is an interesting suggestion which raises both practical and theoretical questions about our understanding of autonomy when a person needs help to be autonomous.

David Shoemaker gives an intriguing comparison between people with mild mental retardation (MMR) and psychopaths, discussing the ways in which they are part of the moral community and whether they are morally responsible for their actions. There is general agreement that people with MMR are part of our moral community while psychopaths are not. Yet people with MMR are not fully responsible for their actions, while psychopaths are. Shoemaker's task is to make sense of this puzzle. He does so by distinguishing the conditions for attributability and accountability. Accountability requires mature emotional capacities, which people with MMR have to a greater or lesser extent, but which psychopaths lack. On the other hand, attributability requires a much more cognitive understanding which psychopaths have and which people with MMR almost completely lack. Shoemaker goes on to discuss how accountability seems to come in degrees, while membership in the moral community is all-or-nothing. This is a valuable paper that deserves to be considered alongside the growing literature on moral responsibility and psychiatric disorders.

The section "Speaking About Cognitive Disorders" includes a paper by Ian Hacking on how autism is giving people with Asperger's a new vocabulary with which to describe their lives. Especially interesting is Hacking's contrasting Asperger's and multiple personality disorders which he had previously discussed. While he was suspicious of the reality of what he called "transient" mental disorders like multiple personality, he has no such suspicions about Asperger's. The role that popular culture and the sharing of language play in constructing the disorders is very different in the two cases. Victoria McGeer provides some useful comments on Hacking's claims, adding to the argument and showing problems with some of his claims. Anna Stubblefield gives an important analysis of the social construction of race and its relation to cognitive disability. Licia Carlson discusses in a meta-way how philosophers approach issues of cognitive disability.

The final section of the book is likely to gather the most attention. It features a rich debate on the relations between the moral status of people with cognitive disabilities and that of non-human animals. Peter Singer and Jeff McMahan argue that we should not take into account a being's species when assessing its moral status, but should base our judgment purely on the intellectual and emotional capacities it has. Singer explains his position, which is by now well known, and he explores some considerations against granting equal moral status to all humans. McMahan's paper is densely argued; he considers our obligations to disabled and non-disabled fetuses and our obligations to non-human animals, both in our duties to avoid harming or killing them, and our obligations to use technology to enhance their IQ when we have the opportunity to do so. Agnieszka Jaworska examines the relation between the capacity to care for others and moral standing.

The last paper is by Eva Feder Kittay and was written after the conference. She reflects on personal considerations and what they mean for the morality of cognitive disability. As the mother of Sesha, who has severe cognitive disabilities, she finds it offensive when individuals write or talk about the abilities and moral status of people like her daughter, comparing them unfavorably with animals. Kittay's concern is with the moral issues involved in debating with people who have strong personal reactions to such claims. She argues that philosophers need to engage others using epistemic responsibility and epistemic modesty, and says that Singer and McMahan failed to do so in their interactions with her. She makes a further argument with a conclusion about the moral status of her daughter: those she has been arguing with say they honor her relationship with Sesha and grant the moral importance of that mother-daughter relationship. Kittay says that this is not an isolated personal relationship. It can only occur in a social context, and she cannot care for her daughter as a mother "if others do not respect her as a being worthy of the same care as is due to any child" (p. 410). To argue that the moral status of people with profound retardation is about the same as that of many non-human animals is to dishonor the relationships of those people with their mothers. Although Kittay does not draw the connection, there is a similarity between her argument and those of Lindemann and Jennings regarding the care of people with moderate and severe dementia. They argue that the care should not be based on the cognitive abilities of the person with dementia, but instead on their relational identities and memorial identity. While these views need to be developed more fully, they certainly deserve attention, for they are some of the best attempts to elucidate the ideas of universal human dignity that have been so important in inspiring a respect for all humans, no matter what their condition.


Oliver M. (1983) Social Work with Disabled People. Basingstoke: Macmillan.