Collective Epistemology

Placeholder book cover

Hans Bernhard Schmid, Daniel Sirtes, and Marcel Weber (eds.), Collective Epistemology, Ontos, 2011, 241pp., $124.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381061.

Reviewed by Frederick F. Schmitt, Indiana University


The articles in this volume cover a wide range of issues in collective epistemology, the conceptual and normative study of the knowledge possessed by social groups and other collectivities. As the editors put it in their introduction to the volume, collective epistemology asks: "First, is it possible to make sense of the notion of social, socialized, or collective knowledge and its production and, second, if this notion does make sense, is it possible to understand and characterize the positive role of sociality in knowledge acquisition?" (p. 3) Is knowledge to be literally ascribed to groups, and how should we understand the relation of these ascriptions to ascriptions of knowledge to individuals within and outside the groups? The volume contains articles addressing how the epistemic powers of groups differ from those of individuals (by Deborah Tollefsen), the extent to which group knowledge or justified belief must be understood as something over and above the knowledge of members of the group (Kay Mathiesen, Anita Konzelmann Ziv, Raimo Tuomela), how individuals are epistemically related within groups (Don Fallis) or to groups (Robert Evans), what account of justified belief plausibly applies to groups (Raul Hakli), and whether a joint commitment argument that it is rational for each member to act in conformity with the group's interest (regardless of whether doing so conforms to the member's self-interest) succeeds (Caroline Baumann).

In her article "Groups as Rational Sources," Tollefsen addresses an important question about the epistemic powers of groups: whether they can serve as sources of testimony. She argues forcefully that some groups are capable of testifying while others are not. She makes her case by arguing for a condition on testifying. Clearly groups can issue statements and make assertions, but this is not sufficient for testifying. On the assurance view of testimony, adopted here by Tollefsen, to testify is to invite one's audience to trust one, thereby taking responsibility for what one says. But hearers will not trust a source that wavers in its assertions, as many groups do, so will not believe its assertions. For this reason, a group that wavers in its assertions will not succeed in testifying. Nor will the assertions of such a group fulfill an essential function of testimony -- that of steadying the minds of hearers. Thus, unlike individuals, groups differ in whether they can testify.

In "Can Groups Be Epistemic Agents?" Mathiesen reviews and defends divergence arguments that have been employed by Margaret Gilbert and others against a summative view of group belief (or acceptance). These arguments describe examples in which a group holds a belief even though some (or even all) individual members of the group do not hold the belief -- from which it is then inferred that a group belief p is not merely a matter of all (or some) members believing p. Mathiesen focuses on an example in which the hiring committee accepts that Jones is a qualified candidate even though a majority of members reject that he is a qualified candidate. One might concede the possibility of such a divergence between group belief and the beliefs of members but claim that such cases are degenerate because in them not all beliefs of the group and the members can be rational. For, one might claim, a group can rationally believe p only if the evidence available to the group favors p (as against contrary propositions); but the evidence available to the group is also available to each member of the group; so if it is rational for the group to believe p, it must also be rational for each member to believe p. The alleged divergence between the group belief and the members' beliefs, one might claim, can be purchased only at the cost either of an irrational group belief p or irrational contrary beliefs (or suspension of belief p) of the members who do not believe p.

Mathiesen replies to this objection by describing divergence cases in which both the group belief p and the members' contrary beliefs are rational because the group has information that the members lack. For example, the hiring committee adopts a procedure for combining individual judgments in which the members do not discuss the case and their votes are aggregated by weighting with respect to their past reliability and confidence level. The members reasonably believe that their collective judgments are likely to be more reliable than their individual judgments. Only one member votes that Jones should be hired, but this member's past reliability and confidence are so great that the group judgment is that Jones should be hired. Before the outcome is announced, the group judgment diverges from the majority of individual judgments. The judgments of all parties are nevertheless rational. For the evidence available to the group differs from that available to each member, since the members don't know each others' votes -- if they did, they would amend them in favor of the group outcome. Mathiesen also argues that "two or more fully epistemically rational agents with access to the same evidence may end up with diverging views on a particular proposition" (p. 39). This is possible because the agents may reasonably set different tolerances for the risk of error. Mathiesen's discussion delves more deeply into the possibility of fully rational divergence than any previous work has done.

In "Collective Epistemic Agency: Virtue and the Spice of Vice," Ziv observes that virtues are self-amplifying and from this observation draws conclusions about the nature of group epistemic virtues. Virtues differ from many repeatable dispositions, like the disposition of a door to be opened, in being amplified by repetition, in the sense that one increases one's disposition to manifest justice in given instances when one increases the number of manifestations of justice. According to Ziv, "the dynamic and self-amplifying character of epistemic virtues warrants their reliability, since it is this character that bottoms out in repeated acts of epistemically correct behavior" (p. 54). As I take it, she claims here that the fact that virtues are self-amplifying in this sense entails that (or explains why) the possession of a virtue increases one's disposition to hold justified or rational beliefs. Ziv then employs this observation about virtues as a constraint that favors some accounts of what a group is over others.

In this way, she argues against Gilbert's account of a group as a plurality of individuals jointly committed to a state of mind or activity. Ziv takes this account to entail that a group has an epistemic virtue only if the virtue is "enacted in the same way as intentions and beliefs are supposed to be enacted" (p. 60) on Gilbert's view (namely, as joint commitments to a state of mind or activity). And Ziv takes her self-amplification constraint on virtues to rule out such an account of group epistemic virtue. For once the trait "is enacted, it is not subject to further modification by individual properties" (p. 60); yet group virtues must be subject to such modification; for they are necessarily amplified by their manifestations and so must change in virtue of changes in the properties of individual members that underlie them. But this argument has no traction against Gilbert's account of groups. For her account does not even suggest that a group epistemic virtue is an enactment, only that it is a disposition to produce enactments (group beliefs) in virtue of an underlying dynamic of individual interactions in the group. And it is just as plausible that for the right dynamic such a disposition is self-amplifying as it is that individual dispositions are self-amplifying. Ziv prefers an approach to group epistemic virtue analogous to Keith Lehrer and Carl Wagner's weighted averaging approach to consensus, because in her view it allows for self-amplification. Since Lehrer and Wagner's approach has been thoroughly evaluated in the literature, I will not discuss it here.

In "An Account of Group Knowledge," Tuomela extends his earlier important work on group knowledge. For Tuomela, although a group can be conceived as an agent, it is not a genuine agent and does not have a mind (p. 77). For this reason, mental attributes are only "extrinsically" attributed to it. What it is for a group to believe, in the central case of a "group-socially normatively binding group belief," is for there to be grounds for reasoning and acting on the belief that are internal to the group -- i.e., directed toward achieving the group ethos. A group's normatively binding belief depends on members' beliefs (directed toward this goal), since a group functions only by the functioning of its members. In addition to his discussion of group belief, Tuomela also sets out detailed conditions of group knowledge that p: roughly, a group accepts that p and is justified in accepting it; the group reason is a joint reason for p; and individual members know p. Tuomela allows that the reasons can be those of particular individuals compiled, as long as these reasons are consistent and there is mutual belief that the reasons form a consistent group reason. These are very plausible conditions of group knowledge.

Hakli, in "On Dialectical Justification of Group Beliefs," treats acceptances of nonsummative groups. These are views deliberatively adopted by the group, possibly diverging from the beliefs of individual members. Hakli thinks that beliefs and acceptances are distinguished by being involuntary and voluntary, respectively, other distinctions such as goal-dependence being inadequate for the distinction. And he argues that internalism, or the requirement that a belief is justified only if the subject has a reason to which he or she has access, holds for acceptances, while externalism holds for beliefs. If a belief is involuntary, we cannot require the subject to have a reason for the belief; so externalism holds. If a belief is voluntary, evaluation requires considering the reasons for it; so internalism holds.

Neither of these points is convincing. The fact that a reason is required of a voluntary attitude does not entail that an externalist condition like reliability is not required. And the argument for externalism about involuntary beliefs assumes both a deontic conception of justification (that a belief is justified only if the subject ought to hold it) and the principle that "ought" implies "can" -- two assumptions that externalists have been inclined to deny. Hakli proceeds by assuming that a group doxastic state is voluntary; so, according to the preceding arguments, an internalist account of justified acceptance applies to justified group doxastic states. But as Gilbert has pointed out, it does not follow even from her voluntarist view of group attitude formation, on which a group belief arises from an express joint commitment of members to a proposition, that a group belief is voluntary; for even an express joint commitment can occur involuntarily. What must be voluntary on her account are the states of the members relevant to forming the joint commitment; it does not follow that the joint commitment is itself a voluntary state of the group. Moving on now, Hakli explores a dialectical account of justified group acceptance -- a default-challenge model, on which a group is justified in accepting p just in case the group "can successfully defend p against reasonable challenges" (p. 134). Although this view is counterintuitive, Hakli forcefully defends it from many objections.

In "Probabilistic Proofs and the Collective Epistemic Goals of Mathematicians," Fallis extends his published arguments that "mathematicians do not have good epistemic grounds" for refusing to prove propositions by probabilistic rather than deductive proofs. Fallis has previously argued that although deductive proofs correctly conducted are infallible and probable proofs are not, we are not infallible in conducting deductive proofs; so the infallibility of deductive proofs is not a reason to prefer them to probable proofs. In the present article he responds to the suggestion of Kenny Easwaran that deductive proofs are epistemically superior to probabilistic proofs because the former are transferable -- a social feature -- while the latter are not: "A proof is transferable if one mathematician can give the proof to another mathematician who can then verify for herself that the mathematical claim in question is true without having to rely at all on the testimony of the first mathematician" (p. 163). Fallis concedes that deductive proofs are transferable and probabilistic proofs are not. But he observes that probabilistic proofs are nevertheless repeatable, and repetition can reduce the risk of error. Thus, mathematicians still have no reason to restrict themselves to deductive proofs. I would suggest looking for the advantage of deductive over probabilistic proofs in the fact that the risk of error in a probabilistic proof is intrinsic to the proof, while in a deductive proof it is extrinsic to the proof. Mathematicians evidently place an underived cognitive value not merely on the instrumental matter of avoiding the risk of error in a proof, but also on the procedural matter of how the risk of error is avoided. If this is right, it has the important consequence that we cannot give a purely instrumentalist account of the basic epistemic value mathematicians ascribe to their accomplishments.

"Collective Epistemology: The Intersection of Group Membership and Expertise," by Evans, explores the tension between the acknowledged epistemic legitimacy of a group, such as a group of scientists, and the politically and socially motivated desire to include more members of society in group decision-making, especially decisions about which research to fund for use in public policy. Evans proposes a four-fold typology generated by the two dichotomies of small versus large group, and ubiquitous expertise versus esoteric expertise. Evidently Evans intends to contribute not only to a description of scientific practice but also to the formulation of norms of practice, as in this suggestion:

whilst it is clearly appropriate to consult with publics about the meanings they attach to particular objects, technologies and imagined futures, and the criteria against which these things should be judged, it seems rather less appropriate to ask them, on the basis of no specialist expertise, to judge what the correct outcome of complex scientific modeling should be. (p. 197)

The proposed norm would seem to be platitudinous, and the description of practice is too sweeping to be instructive.

In "Experimentation versus Theory Choice: A Social-Epistemological Approach," Marcel Weber offers a Kuhnian account of rational scientific theory choice. He begins with an ingenious adaptation by Samir Okasha of Arrow's impossibility theorem to rational scientific theory choice. In place of an individual preference ranking in Arrow, we have a preference ranking of theories, conceived here as induced by one or another criterion for ranking the theories, such as "accuracy, consistency, broad scope, simplicity and fruitfulness" (p. 204). Okasha shows that there is no aggregation of the preference rankings that satisfies various axioms (analogues of those operative in Arrow's theorem) governing a rational aggregation of the criterial rankings. The conclusion is that there is no rational aggregation of the criterial rankings -- no way to combine the criteria into a single rational ranking. This might seem at first a shocking result. But Weber convincingly objects that in the case of the rational aggregation of criteria, unlike that of Arrow's theorem, there is no reason to impose the axiom of non-dictatorship. It may be that one criterion determines the rational aggregate ranking. Weber selects fruitfulness as the rational criterion, attributing that choice to Kuhn. Fruitfulness is a social criterion in the sense that which theories are fruitful is a function of the propagation of research programs, experimental systems, and other social institutions. The sociality discussed in this paper thus arises, not from the aggregation of criteria proposed by individuals, as in social choice theory, but from the content of the rational criterion itself, fruitfulness.

In "Gilbert's Account of Norm-Guided Behavior: A Critique," Baumann objects to two of the claims Gilbert makes in her joint commitment account of groups. The first, psychological claim is that the joint commitments of individuals that constitute groups according to Gilbert explain many group-relevant actions of the members and, by extension, explain some of the behavior of the group in virtue of motivating the individuals to act in conformity with their commitment. The second, normative claim by Gilbert is that these joint commitments explain why it is rational for individuals to act in conformity with the commitment. Baumann raises serious questions about both of these claims. Here I focus on her response to the first claim. She points out that, for Gilbert, to be a party to a joint commitment I must have and express an intention suitably related to the joint commitment, and others must also have and express such an intention, and this must be common knowledge among the parties. But here, according to Baumann, there are not enough psychological states of the individual to motivate the individual's action in conformity with the commitment. My intention is not a full intention to perform such an action. Nor is my belief that I am subject to a joint commitment enough to motivate such an action. For it is a cognitive state of me, and a cognitive state is not sufficient for motivation, at least not on the view of motivation assumed in rational-choice explanation.

This is a serious challenge to Gilbert's account of how a joint commitment motivates action in conformity with the commitment. Gilbert wants to impute a motivation that does not depend merely on my believing that my joint commitment requires me to act in a certain way, together with my desiring to act in a way that conforms to my joint commitment. It would seem that to do so Gilbert must insist that a joint commitment does not reduce to the individual intentions she cites, plus expressions of these intentions, under common knowledge; it merely arises from these conditions; it entails or at least carries with it as a matter of psychology a number of intention-like individual mental attitudes not identical with the individual intentions recognized by the psychology of individual intention in motivation theory and rational-choice explanation; and as a matter of psychology these intention-like states motivate actions in conformity with the commitment. Gilbert would have to argue for this claim on the ground that no other hypothesis on offer explains our motivation to conform to the commitment in the prisoner's dilemma and similar choice situations. Unlike Baumann, I find such an argument promising. But Baumann's pointed challenge is an important contribution to the ongoing debate over the joint commitment approach to collectivities.

The contributions in this volume are accessible to nonspecialists, diverse, and significantly advance the study of collective knowledge. I would regard them as essential reading for those interested in social epistemology.