Collective Identity, Oppression, and the Right to Self-Ascription

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Andrew J. Pierce, Collective Identity, Oppression, and the Right to Self-Ascription, Lexington Books, 2012, 140pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739171905.

Reviewed by Andrew F. Smith, Drexel University


Andrew Pierce takes up three main tasks in this compact text. First, he offers a critique of arguably the most prominent liberal approach to conceptualizing the ascription of collective identity, offered by Will Kymlicka, claiming that it fails to account for the experiences of the oppressed. Second, he defends the proposition that a group-based right to self-ascription is a precondition for the development of a properly constructed collective identity. Third, he argues for a form of identity politics that operates in accordance with the right to self-ascription. Pierce's approach is highly original, as far as I am aware. This book is worthy reading for anyone interested in issues of group rights, oppression, and identity politics. However, I do have some concerns about the viability of his project. I will say more about this after more fully laying out Pierce's position. I proceed by addressing each of Pierce's three tasks in turn.

Task 1: Kymlicka conceives of group identity in terms of cultural identity. Cultural identity, on his account, is a manifestation of collective intentionality; it is a product of the uncoerced, voluntary choice of group members. Cultures are presumed to be complete in the sense that they govern all aspects of their members' lives. They also are regarded as self-sufficient and generally self-contained, coming into conflict with other cultures only accidentally. The protection of group rights for Kymlicka is thus a matter of protecting the individual right of group members to exercise free choice in structuring their collective identity.

Kymlicka distinguishes between two main sorts of groups whose claim to specifiable group rights must be assessed. National minorities, such as indigenous populations, deserve a robust set of special rights and protections. These include political autonomy and exemption from at least some of the laws of the dominant culture, since they have involuntarily fallen under the purview of that culture and the political authority that facilitates it. Ethnic groups, voluntary immigrants who do not initially subscribe to the dominant culture, seek more or less to assimilate politically. Because they freely acquiesce to the political authority of the dominant culture, the group rights of ethnic groups should aim primarily at facilitating their eventual political integration.

Neither categorization provides a fitting model for how oppressed groups have acquired their collective identity, Pierce argues. In contrast to national minorities, oppressed groups are formed non-intentionally. They are established and maintained by external, coercive forces. They are the creation not of free choice among their members but by the limitation of free choice. So conflict is constitutive of their identity formation. In contrast to ethnic minorities, the identity of oppressed groups is predicated on not being permitted to integrate politically. Their very existence reflects their effective political marginalization.

So whereas Kymlicka takes voluntary association to be the paradigmatic means of group constitution, the concept of oppression connotes that said constitution is non-intentional. It conveys that collective identity is not just unchosen but that it is freedom limiting. Oppressed groups are immobilized and disempowered precisely in virtue of their group membership. Oppression is structural in nature in that the experience of it is "related to one's position in a complex web of social arrangements" (29). So oppression is, by definition, a group harm that cannot be reduced to the individual harms experienced by group members.

If oppression is to be abolished, certain rights must be regarded as possessed by groups simpliciter rather than by individual group members. Specifically, the group-based right not to be oppressed or, put positively, the group-based right to self-ascription must be protected by the state. Groups as groups must be free to determine the meaning and extent of their affiliation. This is a necessary condition for group members to freely develop their collective identity.

Task 2: Pierce's defense of the group-based right to self-ascription is rather complex, and he moves quickly in developing it. I will do my best to disentangle its main features. In order to provide a sense of the contours of this right, Pierce relies most strongly on Jürgen Habermas's discourse ethics. According to Habermas, moral and legal theory is based on what Pierce calls "communicative intersubjectivity." Inescapable, counterfactual presuppositions of communication govern how participants in discourse aimed at mutual understanding must engage with one another.

These presuppositions -- namely, that no participant who is able to make a relevant contribution is excluded, that each participant has an equal voice, that each participant is free to speak sincerely, and that discourse proceeds without coercion -- delineate how discourse must proceed if the force of the better argument is to prevail. Although they rarely if ever fully govern actual discourse (they are counterfactual after all), acting in accordance with the presuppositions expresses a sense of affinity with and empathy for fellow participants in discourse. To the extent that Habermas holds that the validity of moral and legal principles is a function of the agreement expressed in discourse among all affected parties, there can be no justice without solidarity, as it were. Solidarity, states Habermas, is the "reverse side" of justice.

While Habermas thus holds that the concept of positive law entails that individuals are bearers of rights, Pierce asserts that the means by which any moral and legal principle is justified "points to a prior communicative intersubjectivity" (4). This is not simply a matter of participants in discourse displaying communicative competence. It is instead "the concrete intersubjectivity of collective identity" (ibid). Cashed out in terms of rights, any conception of individual rights presupposes a group right, specifically to self-ascription. The right to self-ascription, to not be oppressed, makes possible the discursive justification of individual rights. Indeed, the right to self-ascription is a precondition for discursive justification as such, since discursive justification is based on an intersubjective process of communicative vindication. And intersubjective communication is premised on the presuppositions of communication.

Oppression -- the violation of the presuppositions of communication -- renders discursive justification impossible, and it undercuts political integration. It disrupts the material basis for solidarity by perpetuating economic inequality. It impedes the affective basis for solidarity by destroying the trust and mutual respect necessary for political equality. With solidarity undermined, it is impossible to establish just social and political conditions. No solidarity, no justice.

Pierce argues that there are nevertheless limits to his reliance on a Habermasian discursive conception of rights. Since the right to self-ascription is a precondition for discursive justification, it cannot itself be justified procedurally. For this reason, Pierce turns to Axel Honneth and Martha Nussbaum to justify his employment of this right to specify the normative bases of collective identity. In accordance with Honneth's considerations the normative force of the right to self-ascription derives from an underlying structure of mutual recognition. Mutual recognition, which applies to all associational relations on Honneth's account and supports the development of self-confidence, self-respect, and self-esteem, is necessary for intersubjective communication aimed at mutual understanding. From Nussbaum, Pierce appropriates the view that collective identity formation should aim at "intersubjective human flourishing" that does not reduce to the flourishing of individual subjects.

Task 3: Developing this account of the group-based right to self-ascription is meant to provide a firm basis for Pierce's articulation of a "discursive-democratic" conception of identity politics. This conception specifies the proper relationship between groups and the state while avoiding some of the more problematic aspects of identity politics: namely, the fetishization of identity as such and the inclination to claim that any and all identity groups deserve equal recognition. Identity politics, on Pierce's account, aims to demonstrate that the kinds of group identification that are justifiable are those that operate largely in accordance with the presuppositions of communication. Groups thus "must be open and inclusive (to a certain degree), provide equal opportunity for the growth and development of all members, and be adopted sincerely and without coercion" (6).

Ultimately, then, Pierce develops an account of the social construction of identity that is both descriptive and normative. It is descriptive in that it lays out the ideal, non-oppressive, conditions for identity construction. It is normative because it identifies the criteria according to which groups should shape their collective identities, including racial identities. Insofar as collective identities are discursively constructed, they must be governed internally by the presuppositions of communication.

Concerns: Perhaps the most significant difficulty facing Pierce's argument is that he asserts that the right to self-ascription should be understood as a moral right "that undergirds and makes possible legal rights, insofar as those rights depend upon intersubjective processes of discursive justification" (5). First, Pierce himself later remarks that "legal rights and moral rights are distinct, and . . . the former must not be seen as derivative of the latter" (62), hence obscuring the relationship between the right to self-ascription and its legal entailments. Second, it is not clear that Pierce is warranted in granting moral content to the right to self-ascription if, in consonance with Habermas's considerations, morality (like legality) is dependent on discursive justification for which the right to self-ascription is a precondition. The means by which he attempts to suffuse the right with moral content is by drawing on Honneth and Nussbaum to make the right to self-ascription substantive in nature rather than purely procedural. But this raises further problems.

On the one hand, Pierce defies Habermas's proscription against drawing on sources of normativity beyond those available in the presuppositions of communication to ground moral and legal theory. On the other hand, Honneth objects to Habermas's thoroughgoing linguistification of critical social theory. More specifically, the appeals to mutual recognition and intersubjective human flourishing seem to provide the bulk of the theoretical support for Pierce's conceptualization of the right to self-ascription. But Habermas surely would resist the claim that any entailments of his discourse ethic should be conceptually dependent on these criteria -- at least as Honneth and Nussbaum, respectively, flesh them out. Moreover, because Pierce's account of collective identity is drawn primarily -- albeit with due emendations -- from Habermas's account of identity formation, Pierce's defense of the right to self-ascription ends up fitting rather uneasily with the normative bases of collective identity formation that he lays out.

Indeed, drawing on Habermas to conceptualize what Pierce regards as the proper means of collective identity formation raises a further question. Pierce notes that Habermas distinguishes between two forms of collective identification. The former, which is a manifestation of what Habermas characterizes as the sphere of ethics, refers to a robust form of collective identity based on shared beliefs and customs. Ethical discourse is aimed at collective self-clarification: at agreement among members about the values and interests that the group embodies. The latter, weaker form reflects the sphere of morality, or justice, and is constituted by citizens' common assent to the validity of basic constitutional principles. Pierce then contends that there is a strong and important connection between these two forms of collective identification, according to Habermas. Political integration does not, and must not, derive from any particular ethical identity in a post-metaphysical society. But political integration "is interpreted from, and so rooted in" (46) ethical identities in general. This provides a fuller sense of Habermas's claim that solidarity is the reverse side of justice.

But Pierce provides no textual evidence that permits him to attribute this position to Habermas. He does note that at least on one occasion Habermas tepidly affirms that ethical questions and moral questions may in principle overlap. As a result, Pierce intends his assessment of the relationship between discourse ethics and collective identity formation to be "largely speculative" (82). But even this strikes me as an extension of Habermas's thought beyond its viable bounds. Lukewarm affirmation of the possible connection between morality and ethics -- the right and the good -- is hardly a stable basis for Pierce's substantive conception of identity politics.

Furthermore, as far as I am aware, the central thrust of Habermas's claim regarding the relationship between solidarity and justice is that the capacity of each individual to assume the moral point of view in discourse is codependent on equal respect for all discursive partners. Equal respect certainly depends on intersubjective relations of mutual recognition, but these relations are not understood by Habermas in the "thick" way that Honneth conceives of them. To be sure, Pierce is right (i) that discourses of self-clarification assume a political character when they are subject to legislation and (ii) that oppression involves the denial of collective self-clarification and the capacity to take a stand on such legislation. But these propositions suggest that one's ethical identity may in some ways derive from one's political identity rather than the opposite. This being so, I am not convinced that Pierce is warranted in drawing on Habermas to support the claim that the legitimacy of one's political identity derives from one's ethical identity. Pierce's critique of Kymlicka and his discussion of the nature of oppression have considerable merit. His defense of the right to self-ascription and a discursive-democratic identity politics require considerable clarification.