Collective Rationality and Collective Reasoning

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McMahon, Christopher, Collective Rationality and Collective Reasoning, Cambridge University Press, 2001, pp ix+251, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-01178-7.

Reviewed by Gerald F. Gaus, Tulane University


Christopher McMahon’s concern throughout this tightly-argued book is rational “cooperation among people who have conflicting commitments” (1). The first part of the analysis concerns what he calls “collective rationality”—the way in which rational action seeks to secure cooperative outcomes—while the second part focuses on “collective reasoning”—cooperative ways of reasoning together. The master theme, then, is the relation of rationality and cooperation. McMahon’s treatment is comprehensive: we encounter original and suggestive analyses of the foundations of rational choice, morality and the role of democracy and the state. Throughout McMahon gives novel takes on issues concerning rational action, morality and political theory. Although its originality is one of the real strengths of the book, it also makes the book much more difficult to grasp than it may first appear. Underlying the clear prose are unorthodox characterizations of familiar issues and concepts, characterizations that are often difficult to nail down.

For example, as McMahon understands it, a theory of rationality “correlates each action with the outcome it will produce, where production is understood to encompass any way that an action can make a difference in the world,” including simply that the act in question has been performed (7). And “what there is the best reason for an agent to do is determined by the value (from the agent’s point of view) of the outcomes correlated with the available actions” (7). McMahon, though, refuses to explicate value in terms of preference satisfaction; “value is determined by principles that constitute certain features of outcomes as reasons for producing them” (7, emphasis in original). On first sight, this seems simply to say, roughly, that values provide reasons to act; thus the tie with utility theory. However, this is too rough. McMahon advances two relations. First, he says that principles determine value; value somehow depends, perhaps conceptually, on principles. The dependence relation, though, is not really explicated. Intuitively it would seem that ‘value V is determined by a principle P’ should be understood as ‘value V only if P’. Should we take it as saying something stronger—that value V if and only if P? This makes it hard to see how value depends on principles of value in any way that the principles do not equally depend on value; we would never have principles without the value. I think, then, that something like ‘value V only if P’ is the most plausible interpretation. Second, we are told that a principle constitutes features of outcomes as reasons. This too is somewhat puzzling. One might take it as claiming that a principle is constituted by a determination that act X is associated with outcome O that in turn has feature f that provide reasons to X. Alternatively, and probably more plausibly, one might interpret the claim as saying that principle P constitutes (renders it the case) that feature f of outcome O is a reason to perform act X. This would imply that R is a reason to X if and only if, given some f of the outcome O that X produces, P renders it the case that R is a reason to X. (To put it bluntly, something is a reason if P says that it is). Now we might think that whether P renders it the case that R is reason to perform X would depend on the value V of the features of O. But we have seen that while V “depends” on P, the relation is not obviously biconditional. We can have P without V; but then, how could P render R a reason to X? Perhaps we should say that R is a reason to X if P yields V, and P, given V, renders R a reason on the basis of the features of the outcomes associated with X.

I point out this initial difficulty as, first, it seems to go to the crux of the matter: the relation between values, principles of value and reasons is not pellucid (the index cross references these ideas, but does not help much in getting the relation between them clear). Second, it is indicative of a more general difficulty a reader confronts. McMahon wishes to alter the terms of analyses of rational action, and so replaces, for example, ‘preference’ with ‘principle of value.’ This recasting of rational action theory is one of the great merits and attractions of the book. However, when one tries to lay out precisely what claims are being made, and the relations between key ideas, one finds that what seemed like a clear idea is much harder to grasp than it first appears.


The key idea of McMahon’s account of collective rationality is the “correlation” of “actions and outcomes” (7). All principles of rationality, as I understand him, correlate actions with their outcomes, but they do so in different ways. The “principle of individual rationality” (PIR) is McMahon’s translation of standard maximization theory: an agent correlates each action with an outcome, and then rationally chooses that action that is associated with the highest value to the agent. As is well-known, in prisoner dilemmas this results in the dominance of a non-cooperative actions. Whatever the other agent does, the action that is correlated with the most value to each player is defection. Now, McMahon argues, the “principle of collective rationality” (PCR) correlates actions and outcomes in a different way. When a person is playing a prisoner’s dilemma, the PCR “directs him to compare the value of the outcomes produced by two different combinations of actions” (8): the combinations {I defect, you defect} and {I cooperate, you cooperate}. The former combination of actions is correlated with less value to me than the latter, so the PCR directs us to cooperate. Agents who follow the PCR will be able to cooperate in “competitive” games such as the prisoner’s dilemma (which, in essence, they convert into a cooperative game); they will also be able to cooperate in assurance games and achieve certain other cooperative goods. Essentially, people who adopt the PCR treat competitive games such as the prisoner’s dilemma as if they were cooperative games or, “more precisely…that to be cooperatively disposed is to assign the same payoff to defection that one assigns to the noncooperative outcome” (21).

The aim is to explain the rationality of cooperation in apparently competitive situations such as the prisoner’s dilemma. This general solution already has been explored by, among others, David Schmidtz (1995), Kurt Baier (1995) and David Gauthier (1986): the aim is to identify a different, more social and less individualistic, notion of rationality that can make sense of cooperative action in what look like prisoner’s dilemmas. One option is to advocate an explicitly non-maximizing conception of rationality; another route is to advocate a theory that does not choose over individual actions. McMahon has us choose over sets of acts, some of which are performed by me and some by others.

The question regarding all such attempts to “solve the prisoner’s dilemma” is whether one is advocating a different, non individually-maximizing, conception of rationality, or simply fiddling with the payoffs such that what looks like a prisoner’s dilemma is really a different sort of game (see Blackburn 1998, 183-190). Interestingly, McMahon is himself ambivalent about this; he admits that the behavior of a person following the PCR can be modeled by standard utility theory, and that the actions of someone following the PCR are equivalent to someone who has payoffs that do not correspond to the prisoner’s dilemma. The question, then, is why should we think a different principle of rationality is involved in cooperative action, rather than just a utility function that favors cooperative outcomes? Many tend to insist that a special non-maximizing conception of rationality is involved because, after all, two players who managed cooperate in a prisoner’s dilemma would, in a straightforward sense, do better than agents who pursued the orthodox dominant strategy. Thus McMahon resists modeling cooperative choices as moral choices (i.e., choices based on some extra constraint on utility functions, such as that all choices must be universalizable). The PCR, he insists, is a principle of rationality, not morality, as it only dictates cooperation by agent A when the benefits to A exceeds A’s cost (29).


Based on the PCR McMahon explores group cooperation, and especially cooperation in groups characterized by moral disagreement. When applied to conflicts of moral values, the PCR points the way to cooperation when moral values are understood as if they were simply individual interests. When moral values are understood as properly moral, it may well be impossible to arrive at cooperative, mutually beneficial, structures of interaction, as people are apt to be unwilling to compromise their moral values. If, however, in at least some cases of moral conflict, individuals “demote” their moral values to mere interests, then a cooperative scheme can be justified. “[G]iven that some scheme chosen is feasible, under the PCR, for all members of the group—given that each regards it as preferable to the noncooperative outcome—even those members who cannot view the choice as guided by reason will still be able to regard themselves as genuinely making the world a morally better place, in lights of their values, by contributing as directed to that scheme” (42). McMahon is ambivalent about this demotion of moral values to interests: it is to be avoided if possible, but sometimes cooperation can only achieved through reason if cooperators demote moral values in this way. This is a important idea: without doubt, cooperation in liberal societies, characterized by moral and religious conflict, is achieved by treating people’s deep moral and religious convictions as if they were simply personal interests. McMahon is both aware of how important this is, and at the same time of its costs. As McMahon sees it, there are two themes in contemporary views of liberalism, both deriving from Rawls: that the state is a cooperative venture for mutual advantage, and that its members seek to advance not interests, but conceptions of the good. What he tries to show in this book is that the two ideas are to a certain extent at odds with each other, and putting them together requires some sacrifice

It is worth pointing out that at two crucial points in his analysis of rationality, McMahon depends on a counterfactual of the form: “If we do not see Xs as Ys, we will be unable to obtain the benefits of cooperation; therefore rationality permits us to take Xs as Ys.” The argument for the PCR appeals to the claim that if we take prisoner’s dilemmas as coordination games, we can obtain benefits; the argument for certain cooperative structures appeals to a similar idea, that if we treat moral values as interests, we can obtain cooperative benefits. This is, to be sure, an interesting line of argument, but it hard to not raise one’s eyebrows at it. If I took low fat yogurt as pizza, my cholesterol would be lower, and I would probably be overall better off. But low fat yogurt is not pizza, and it would seem quite irrational for me to see it as pizza, regardless of how much good might come from doing so.


McMahon employs the idea of a cooperative scheme or structure as the grounds for insightful analyses of authority, political obligation, government and the state. This leads him to a discussion of democracy and the second main theme of his book, “collective reasoning.” Cognitive cooperation, he tells us, is cooperation to achieve epistemic goals, thus collective reasoning is “the cooperative assessment of the rational force of the (putative) facts offered as reasons” (104). Collective reason involves “linguistic exchange, to answer a question or solve a problem, confronting a group” (105). McMahon distinguishes two interpretations of collective reasoning:

In the case of reasoning by an individual, the normal outcome is a judgment by that individual concerning which answer to the question being considered is best supported by the relevant reasons. That is, individual reasoning is followed by individual judgment. But in the case of collective reasoning we have a choice. We can understand cooperation involved as focusing only on the first aspect of the process, or on both aspects. That is, one possibility is to regard individuals engaged in collective reasoning as cooperating in the reasoning they do, gathering facts and assessing their rational significance—but then making individual judgments based on the common stock of reasons thus created. … Alternatively, we can regard the parties as extending cooperation to the act of judgment. After cooperatively evaluating the relevant reasons, they make a collective judgment concerning what these reasons support (109).

The second interpretation does indeed seem to be a sort of collective reasoning; it is the sort of “public reason” that Hobbes endorses, where the sovereign’s judgment becomes the judgment of everyone (Gauthier, 1995). McMahon, however, argues against this stronger conception of collective reasoning, in favor of the weaker, first, possibility, according to which collective reasoning involves a pooling of arguments and reasons, but not a collective judgment. To be sure, even on this weaker interpretation agreement is typically the goal, insofar we seek to arrive at the best judgment, but shared judgment is not integral to the activity. This understanding of collective reasoning provides the foundation of McMahon’s analyses of the moral point of view, Habermas’s and Scanlon’s moral theories—all of which suppose some notion of reasoning together impartially. The ideal of reasoning together—including when it is important—and a sort of weak version of deliberative democracy informs much of this discussion of collective reasoning.

Throughout the discussion, the idea of a group confronting a problem and reasoning together is fundamental, yet it is never quite clear what a group is. Consequently, it is not clear just how to understand the contrast between individual and collective reasoning. When I read Hobbes, and deliberate about conflict under conditions of uncertainty, am I deliberating as an individual, or am I pooling my reasons with Hobbes’s, and those of all the political theorists he was responding to, as well as all my teachers of Leviathan? Indeed, given that most of the deliberative considerations I employ have been trawled from the social pool of reasons, it is not clear what it means to say I ever deliberate “individually.” Since the distinction between individual and collective reasoning cannot be based on whether I draw on a common pool of insights and considerations (there would then hardly be any individual reasoning), it must turn on something else. One possibility is that collective reasoning must involve a two-way exchange of views: Hobbes can change my mind but I cannot change his. But it is hard to see why an exchange should be necessary: suppose you are in chat room and I am observing the exchange; it seems arbitrary to say you, but not I, am engaging in collective reasoning, even though we are drawing on the deliberations of others to arrive at better answers. Another distinguishing feature might be what constitutes a “group” and a common problem, yet these ideas are not well explicated. And even if they were, if almost all reasoning crucially involves drawing on social capital, it is not clear whether McMahon’s notion of “collective” reasoning has any interesting “non-collective” contrast.


Collective Rationality and Collective Reasoning is a deeply thoughtful and highly original investigation of practical reason and social cooperation. It is packed with new arguments and novel insights. And it is based on a real insight: standard models of rational action are inadequate in explaining social and moral life. McMahon is right: the theory of practical rationality cannot be reduced to what he calls the PIR— the principle of individual rationality, which aims at the maximal fulfillment of an individual’s goals. I am, however, unconvinced that, in light of the inadequacy of personal maximization as the alpha and omega of practical reason, we ought to resort to collective rationality and reasoning.


Baier, Kurt (1995) The Rational and the Moral Order. Chicago: Open Court.

Blackburn, Simon (1998) Ruling Passions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Gauthier, David (1986) Morals by Agreement. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Gauthier, David (1995) “Public Reason,” Social Philosophy & Policy, vol. 12 (Winter): 19–42.

Schmidtz, David (1995) Rational Choice and Moral Agency. Princeton: Princeton University Press.