Collective Rationality: Equilibrium in Cooperative Games

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Paul Weirich, Collective Rationality: Equilibrium in Cooperative Games, Oxford UP, 2010, 270pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195388381.

Reviewed by Martin Peterson, Eindhoven University of Technology



In Collective Rationality, Paul Weirich presents a very precise account of what collective rationality amounts to, proposes a new generalised equilibrium concept that he argues is more plausible than Nash’s, and briefly discusses the implications of his views for other philosophical topics. One of the many strengths of Weirich’s book is that he, surprisingly, has managed to present his view about a highly complex topic without using unnecessary equations or other mathematical expressions. This is a book that can, and should, be read by anyone interested in the most basic principles of collective rationality.

Weirich’s point of departure is the claim that groups “literally perform acts” (p 3). That is, groups do not just perform acts in a metaphorical sense, they perform acts in the same sense as other agents. Weirich admits that groups lack desires, beliefs and other mental properties. However, on his view, this does not preclude groups from being autonomous agents. According to the theory proposed by Weirich, groups qualify as agents because they are free. Freedom is a sufficient condition for agency. Any entity that is free to choose is an agent whose actions can be evaluated by rationality, and according to Weirich groups satisfy this condition.

Weirich’s theory certainly goes against conventional philosophical wisdom. This of course contributes to making his theory interesting. However, in order for Weirich to make his claims plausible, he must defend his view against certain challenges: Why should we believe that groups literally perform acts because they are free, and exactly what does this mean? Groups do of course cause events, but being the cause of an event is not sufficient for freedom or agency. Weirich, perhaps wisely, refrains from presenting a philosophical definition of freedom. He correctly points out that that is to a large extent a separate debate, even though it is of course highly relevant to his project.

However, we at least get to know that a free act need not be a product of deliberation. In order to illustrate this point, Weirich asks us to suppose that people in Scotland put on their woolies in September in response to a change in the weather and not in response to each other. Weirich claims that, “I count the group as a collective agent and their combined acts as a collective act.” (p 10) Rather than questioning whether this view really is consistent with how we usually talk about acts and agency, it is perhaps better to regard it as a stipulative definition and see where it leads us. (This is at least what I take to be the most charitable interpretation of Weirich’s proposal.)

So what principles of rationality are applicable to groups then? Weirich argues that for groups rationality is “compositional”. This is one of the key claims of the book. The basic idea is that, “Rationality evaluates by comparisons only options that an agent controls directly and evaluates by components options that an agent controls indirectly” (p 29). Since collective acts consist of individual acts the principle of compositionality is important for establishing a link between collective rationality and individual rationality. Consider, for instance, the principle of utility maximisation. This is a comparative principle, which means that it only applies to sets of acts over which an agent has direct control. Sometimes the members of a group only have direct control over their own acts, and this may prevent rational individuals from maximising overall utility. This is exactly what is entailed by the principle of compositionality. Since each individual only has direct control over his own acts, rationality evaluates the options faced by the group by its components. Weirich points out that if an act performed by a group falls short of a standard of collective rationality, then it has to be the case that some member’s contribution is irrational. The reverse need not be true, however. Two or more group members can of course perform irrational acts that cancel out each other on a group level.

A major part of the book is devoted to a precise but non-mathematical discussion of game theory. For obvious reasons, game theory is a very helpful tool for analysing collective rationality. The upshot of Weirich’s discussion is an argument to the effect that the traditional equilibrium concept proposed by Nash should be replaced by a new equilibrium concept, which Weirich calls strategic equilibrium. While this is an interesting idea, it is not entirely new. Weirich originally introduced the concept of strategic equilibrium into game theory in the 1990’s. By definition, “a strategic equilibrium is a profile of jointly self-supporting strategies” (p 109). The notion of self-support is closely related to, and perhaps an improvement of, the notion of self-ratification discussed in decision theory. Every decision-problem has a self-supporting option, and every self-ratifiable option is self-supportive, but not every self-supportive option is self-ratifiable. Weirich claims that self-support is a necessary condition for ideal agents in ideal circumstances.

So why is the notion of strategic equilibrium better, or more useful, or closer to the truth, than the notion of Nash equilibrium? In order to understand Weirich’s argument, we must recall that every game with a finite number of strategies and agents has a Nash equilibrium, but some of those equilibria will require mixed strategies (i.e. randomisation). Weirich argues that an advantage of adopting his concept of strategic equilibrium is that such an equilibrium is attainable also in cases where a pure Nash equilibrium is out of reach. That is, if one believes that it is sometimes unrealistic to consider mixed strategies (because no such strategies happen to be available to the agent, for one reason or another) it might be attractive to look for generalizations of Nash’s equilibrium concept. A wide range of such proposals have been presented by game theorists over the past decades.

Having said all this, I am not entirely convinced that the notion of strategic equilibrium is as important as Weirich argues. In my view, one can plausibly question whether mixed strategies are not always available to the agent. Sure, people do not always walk around with a coin and a die in their pockets. But according to a common proposal, mixed strategies are merely representations of one agent’s strategies in the minds of other agents. This view is of course compatible with the claim that the agent herself never randomises among options in any genuine sense.

Weirich’s response to this defense of mixed strategies is to point out that one can construct a three-agent game in which two agents attribute different subjective probabilities to the pure strategies of the third agent; then it seems that the third agent would lack a mixed strategy in the relevant sense. However, in response to this it could perhaps be remarked that there may also be other ways in which one can make sense of the notion of mixed strategies, without making the implausible assumption that people always walk around with a coin and a die in their pockets. Why not just argue that agents, including collective agents, sometime make genuine random choices? Given that we have already accepted rather controversial views about agency and freedom, this does not appear to be entirely implausible. From a philosophical point of view it is perhaps odd to claim that some choices are genuine random choices, and that we can more or less actively decide to make such random choices. It might very well be true that we do not currently understand how this is possible, but to just rule it out without further ado in order to motivate the need for a generalisation of the Nash equilibrium is perhaps too quick.

My objection to Weirich can thus be summarised as follows: It is true that the problems associated with mixed strategies must be taken seriously. But it is not obvious that the best way to do this is to give up Nash’s equilibrium concept and replace it with Weirich’s notion of strategic equilibrium. Another way out of this predicament could be to simply revise our view about how agents make choices, and make room for genuine random choices.

Weirich makes it clear already in the beginning of the book that his official aim is to present a unified account of collective rationality, rather than just a set of piecemeal remarks. I think it fair to say that he actually manages to reach this aim: rather than just making minor contributions to a large number of separate problems, Weirich shows that all those problems have a lot in common and can be analysed along roughly the same lines. This is very impressive. That said, it is also a bit difficult for the reader to adjudicate exactly how all parts of the unified theory hang together. Although I agree with Weirich that it is a great sin to make a book longer than necessary, I found some of Weirich’s explanation to be a bit too short. If the number of examples had been larger it would certainly have been easier to understand how the various parts of the theory fit together. Another minor point of criticism is the fact that the link between the views put forward in Collective Rationality and other views discussed in the contemporary literature is sometimes not fully explained to the reader. Although it is of course reasonable to expect the reader to have a good overview of the literature before reading Collective Rationality, I sometimes found it quite hard to separate the sentences and paragraphs that Weirich takes to contain new material from the sentences and paragraphs that are mainly meant to summarise the existing literature.

At the end of the day, the latter points are however of minor importance. My overall conclusion is that Weirich’s theory of collective rationality is a very precise, internally coherent, and highly impressive contribution to the literature. It deserves to be carefully studied in the years to come.