The Conceptual Foundations of Transitional Justice

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Colleen Murphy, The Conceptual Foundations of Transitional Justice, Cambridge University Press, 221pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107449688.

Reviewed by Patti Lenard, University of Ottawa


It is an immense pleasure to read a text in moral philosophy that tackles a large and complicated topic, in which the author refuses to shy away from its messy details. Colleen Murphy does just that in this book, in which she sets as her task a nearly impossible one, to construct a new understanding of justice that is appropriate for societies transitioning away conflict and repression, towards stability and democratic rule. Murphy's objective, therefore, is to articulate "what transitional justice demands" (p. 6). This task is especially complicated, because what it will demand in particular states is context-dependent; every transitional society is transitioning in its own way, struggling with context-specific injustices in a culturally specific setting. To these complicated questions, Murphy brings a careful philosophical style, combined with a clear expertise in the broad areas of reparation and reconciliation, to generate a truly sweeping and insightful text.

Murphy begins her account with four "circumstances of transitional justice", that is, circumstances which describe transitioning societies. For one thing, transitional societies are defined by "pervasive structural inequality"; the political, legal and economic institutions that structure relations among individuals in a transitioning society are rigged, against some people and in favour of others. Specifically, "structural inequality reflects a failure to grant or recognize the equal status of (some) individuals or groups", the consequence of which is that some individuals and groups are systematically disadvantaged in a range of domains (p. 46). For another, transitioning societies are defined by "normalized collective and political wrongdoing", that is, the human rights (which Murphy understands broadly) of some individuals or classes of individuals are systematically violated, often for political gain, by specific, identifiable, and usually more powerful groups (p. 53). The violation of rights is moreover normalized, that is, so that "taken as a basic fact of life for individuals in the society in question, it is or becomes seen as unexceptional" (p. 55). Third, transitional societies are characterized by "serious existential uncertainty", in which the future of the society is "deeply unclear" (p. 66). Finally, transitional societies are characterized by "fundamental uncertainty about authority", that is, by "ambiguity [among a population] about the standing of a political regime to rule and enforce rules" (p. 72).

This might seem like an account of any unstable state, riddled with inequalities along ethnic, cultural, religious lines, in which political authority is exercised in unjust ways. How then will we be able to distinguish a transitioning society from a society that is, simply, in conflict? Murphy concedes that it is often hard to know whether a society is in fact in transition, but it is noteworthy and perhaps confusing that none of the key features of a transitioning society is an expressed desire for transition by members of the society itself. That is, it is reasonable to assume that a person living in a society like the kind Murphy describes would prefer to live under alternative conditions, but their preference does not make the society itself a "transitional" one in any obvious way. To the extent that Murphy's account of the circumstances of transitional justice doesn't provide readers with tools to identify when unstable states can plausibility understood as transitioning, it may seem unsatisfying.

By way of elaborating the circumstances of justice for transitioning societies, Murphy compares transition states and democratic states, along each of the dimensions of the circumstances of justice she identifies. Her aim here is to show that democracies need not be perfect -- democracies may well be characterized by some of the circumstances of justice that characterize transition states. But there is another contrast here, which to my mind highlights the importance of being able to identify, with at least a tad more precision, transitioning states, and that is between transitioning states and failing states. One key contrast here is, it seems to me, that members of a transitioning state -- however rampant the inequalities, however rampant the collective and political violence, and however uncertain the authority of the political leaders -- believe nevertheless that they are members of a shared state, however imperfect and unjust. They desire to continue, at least to some degree, as a state, together. The same is presumably not true of failing or failed states. And so, it seems to me, just as Murphy provided us with a story for why transitioning states are distinct from democratic states, we might similarly benefit from a story for why we should treat a given state as transitioning rather than failing or failed.

Having offered an account of the circumstances of transitional justice, Murphy turns to an account of transitional justice itself. Transitional justice, she says, ought to be treated as an entirely distinct form of justice. One might resist the thought that we need an entirely new form of justice -- but, she says, all other forms of justice with which we are familiar, including corrective justice and retributive justice, assume the existence of relatively stable background conditions, and these stable conditions cannot be assumed in conditions of transition. Rather than combining key elements of these more familiar forms of justice, we should treat transitional justice as "distinctive, and not simply reducible to the other kinds of justice with which we are familiar" (p. 111). What, then, "constitutes the just pursuit of societal transformation?" There are two key parts: societal transformation itself and its just pursuit. Murphy treats each of these components in separate chapters.

Murphy proposes that we understand the two pieces as analogous to the two components of just war theory: jus ad bellum (just cause for war) and jus in bello (justice in war). Transformed, as it were, into transitional justice terms, the former refers to the process by which society is transformed, and the latter refers to the fair and appropriate treatment of both perpetrators and victims. The value added by the just war analogy is limited and perhaps distracting (it seems to this reader that nothing would be lost from the analysis if the analogy weren't repeatedly invoked), but the distinction Murphy aims to draw between the two components serves to distinguish two distinct, but equally important, elements of a just transition.

Of the first component, Murphy says that transforming society is a matter of transforming the political and social relations among its members. Any transitioning society is characterized by relations of power and inequalities, in ways that render some people vulnerable to the whims of others. There is an absence of reciprocity and respect for agency, both of which need to be re-established in order for relations of equality to take hold. To make this case, Murphy relies on a vast literature from rule of law theory to capability theory to theories of trust, which she summarizes at perhaps too much length (at least for those versed in the work she is summarizing). But her conclusion is as insightful as it is important: the aim must be to alter how members of a society relate to each other and how they understand the shared law that governs them, so that shared rule under conditions of reciprocity and respect can emerge, one step at a time. Other theorists of trust simply note that trust is hard to build and easy to destroy; Murphy confronts directly the details of rebuilding the trust that is essential to actually transform a society.

Of the second component, Murphy says that we cannot ignore that in a transitioning society there are groups of individuals who have committed wrongdoing against others. But, the right way to remedy the harms caused by this wrongdoing is not properly captured by prior accounts of corrective or retributive justice, which do not do well at capturing the political and collective nature of the wrongdoing, nor its normalized status in society. Murphy proposes that we confront the variety of justice-based claims that are made in transitioning societies in a "holistic way." Such a strategy is backward and forward-looking, at the same time:

we cannot define the appropriate backward-looking way to hold those implicated in past wrongdoing accountable without taking into account the existing structure of relationships within which this wrongdoing occurred, which is a structure of pervasive inequality in the relationships among citizens and between citizens and officials. (p. 165)

Readers could be forgiven, I think, for finding the task at hand intimidating, and Murphy deserves tremendous credit for refusing to blink. She supports her readers by first focusing on the needs of victims (to see that the reparations are appropriately fitting, given the wrongdoing perpetrated) and then by focusing on what perpetrators must do to properly make amends that can lead to the transformation sought.

She might have supported us more by offering more than glimpses into the experiences of transitional states (in my view, she relied too often on hypothetical examples than on actual examples, though this may be a question of taste), or indeed by offering more optimistic case-studies. At the conclusion of the final chapter, Murphy asks readers to consider two cases, one in northern Uganda and one in the former Yugoslavia. Murphy reports that in Uganda in 2000, the government initiated a half-hearted attempt to offer redress of some kind to women and girls who were abducted by a range of parties over roughly 15 years of conflict, and subjected to repeated sexual violence (from which many children were born). Upon return to their communities, these women and children were treated neither as moral agents nor as equal members of their political communities, and the government did not discourage their communities from treating them as complicit in what befell them, rather than as victims. In this case, the victims of wrongdoing were failed, and so transitional justice was not achieved. In the second case, Murphy considers the decisions rendered by the International Criminal Tribunal for the Former Yugoslavia (ICTY), which charged and convicted many of those personally involved in directing or perpetrating horrific violence on a range of ethnic groups across multiple jurisdictions. But trials like the ones presided over by the ICTY, says Murphy, "stand little chance at holding particular perpetrators accountable for their role in collective and political wrongdoing and little chance of expressing an effective message of repudiation of the wrongdoing that took place" (p. 186).

And so, the book concludes with two sustained discussions of failed attempts to achieve transitional justice, and this seems an imperfect choice, especially for readers keen to know that just transition is possible. It is perhaps indicative of the field in general; that is, perhaps unstable states are doomed to do injustice in spite of a desire to transition to something better. Indeed, if the goals for transition are as robust as Murphy claims, perhaps it is inevitable that actual transitions are failures from the perspective of justice. Perhaps, though, the answer is to lower the standards required to declare that transitional justice has been achieved. Without a sample 'success story', or at least an account of where we might declare transitions to be adequately just, if not fully just according to the standards Murphy sets out, it is hard to conclude this book with much optimism! Nevertheless, the book is a sophisticated and analytic account of a timely topic, and merits a careful read by those with an interest in the challenges of transitioning from injustice to justice in circumstances that make the transition, without good guidance of the kind Murphy offers, seem impossible to achieve.