Collingwood and the Metaphysics of Experience

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D'Oro, Giuseppina, Collingwood and the Metaphysics of Experience, Routledge, 2002, 192pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415239710.

Reviewed by Gary Ciocco, Wheeling Jesuit University


Giuseppina D’Oro adds to Collingwood scholarship with this small treatise devoted to defending him and to resurrecting his Kantian heritage. The major scholarly disputes over Collingwood are downplayed; instead, the “unusual strategy of beginning by assuming that there is continuity between the early and the later Collingwood” is employed (2). In Chapter Two of her ten-chapter, 142-page text, D’Oro repeats the refrain of Collingwood scholars worldwide—that his contribution to the history of philosophy has been largely ignored. Indeed, philosophy textbooks almost always exclude even the mention of Collingwood. Louis Mink commented over thirty years ago in Mind, History and Dialectic that Collingwood was probably the most widely read neglected philosopher of our time (MHD 1). D’Oro focuses on Collingwood’s discussions of philosophical method and of metaphysics and defends the importance of his ideas on these matters. Part of the longstanding neglect of Collingwood’s ideas on method and metaphysics is due to his initiative to reform metaphysics rather than just criticize it. His attempts at this reformation occur most directly in An Essay on Philosophical Method(EPM), An Autobiography(AA), and An Essay on Metaphysics(EM), and these three texts, along with the perennial The Idea of History(IH), are the focus of this book. Collingwood’s supposed “radical conversion” to historicism in his later writings is covered, but only in order to explain the importance of philosophy as “a reflexive activity whose task is to bring to light or render explicit what was already implicitly known” (9).

Collingwood’s connection to Hegel is ignored as D’Oro tries to defend the claim that Collingwood’s notion of metaphysics, and of philosophy in general, was inspired by Kant. It is argued that Collingwood’s metaphysics of experience is grounded in the elegantly written EPM, published in 1933, in which he unveils his idea that the method of philosophy is neither deductive nor inductive. The philosopher begins from experience—the first-order practice of a certain discipline, such as art, science or history—and

uncovers principles that are a priori, not in the sense that they are necessarily true, or cannot be denied without contradiction, but in the sense that they underpin, structure and make possible a particular area of knowledge or experience … . The principles that the philosopher advances as capturing the deep structure of a particular area of experience are justified to the extent that they succeed in explaining the nature of the activity singled out for attention, not to the extent that they are intuitively or deductively true (10).

Philosophy is both normative and descriptive; Collingwood calls this dual nature “criteriological” and emphasizes that the philosopher’s concern with logic perfectly fits this nature, since logic both describes how we actually think and how we ought to think (12). The logic of philosophy, as expressed in EPM, is based on the idea of overlapping classes, by virtue of which, for example, a single action can be called “pleasant, expedient and right” (15). This is so because a philosophical distinction “is a distinction without a difference” (15; EPM 50) and subdividing a philosophical concept into its specific classes is “a purely internal or conceptual distinction” (15). In EM, Collingwood changes his language but not his point; he argues that the philosopher is concerned with uncovering “presuppositions,” which are “assumptions of a logical nature” (16). This concern is a metaphysical one, since it “arises out of the recognition that there is an element in knowledge that is non-empirical” (16). In Collingwood’s “metaphysics without ontology,” the philosopher does not discover ultimate truths about reality, but the principles that govern experience.

Whether Collingwood’s method is called ’the metaphysics of experience’, ’descriptive metaphysics’, or ’metaphysics without ontology’, it is a radicalized Kantian transcendentalism (25). Kant and Collingwood share the following themes: an attempt to reform metaphysics rather than just criticize it; a complicated idealism; an emphasis on logic rather than on psychology within epistemology; and, a “regressive” method, that is, one which proceeds from a fact of experience to its logical ground. Unlike Kant, however, Collingwood makes it clear that philosophy does not expand our knowledge; rather, it adds an entirely new category of propositions into the mix. In addition to matters of fact and relations of ideas, to use Humean terms, there are philosophical propositions, which “express the kind of explanations which are employed by the practitioners of different discipline” (33). These philosophical propositions are synthetic . priori, but only in a weak epistemic sense because they are explanatorily necessary (33). Collingwood argues against epistemological skepticism, but he also breaks with Kant by emphasizing the futility of “speaking of an unknowable residue beyond the sphere of conscious experience” (36).

Collingwood’s anti-realism is presented succinctly in AA in the claim that “the knower does make a difference to what is known” (AA 44). According to D’Oro, the realists of Collingwood’s time, especially Prichard, failed to distinguish epistemological idealism (Kant’s and Collingwood’s) from ontological idealism (Berkeley’s). Collingwood’s idealism is epistemological, and this is gathered from his primary, if not exclusive interest in “intentional objects, objects as known” (45). Things in themselves cannot be described as unknown to us, precisely because “it does not make sense to speak of knowing them at all” (47). Collingwood differs from epistemological pragmatists and from ethical consequentialists as well, since he, unlike them, does not consider metaphysical maxims to be “superfluous” (48). Pragmatists also hope for a non-normative form of discourse, says D’Oro, which will not work for Collingwood, who wants to retain, “within the framework of a metaphysics of principles, the normative role that transcendent entities played in Platonic metaphysics” (51-2).

Collingwood’s also adopts an epistemic anti-naturalism. In EPM, he does not reify universals, but his Platonism is found in the idea of concepts being “understood as ideal standards against which particulars are compared” (59). Philosophical concepts add nothing to the world; in the course of exemplifying such concepts, empirical entities are described (60). In EM, Collingwood explicitly defends his idea of unique philosophical propositions against the logical positivists who would reject them because they are neither empirically nor analytically verifiable. Proponents of the radical conversion often fail to notice that in EM Collingwood “chose his terminology specifically in order to be understood by his philosophical opponents” (63). In this vein, philosophy is not concerned with propositions which can be true/false, but with absolute presuppositions, which “are not answers to any questions, but constitute the condition of the possibility of providing empirically true/false answers in propositional form” (64). As part of Collingwood’s ’logic of question and answer’, absolute presuppositions are important because they are “not questions to which genuine yes and no answers can be given” (65). The statement ’God exists’ is a classical example of an absolute presupposition, specifically one of religious experience. To turn that presupposition into the question, ’Does God exist?’, however, is not really proper—from the point of view of religious belief or experience, a positive answer to the question is a necessary presupposition. EPM and EM thus have the same goal—to show that absolute presuppositions, the subject-matter of metaphysics, are not meaningless; but, because they are not empirical, they require another method of verification, the method of determining “whether they are true to the kind of experience or knowledge that they make possible” (65).

D’Oro connects Collingwood’s need to defend the ontological argument with his iconoclastic interpretation of it, in which Anselm’s famous proof “is innocent of strong ontological implications” and is thus compatible with a descriptive metaphysics (75). As Collingwood writes: “What [Anselm] proves is not that because our idea of God is an idea of id quo maius cogitari nequit, therefore God exists, but that because our idea of God is an idea of id quo maius cogitari nequit, we stand committed to belief in God’s existence” (77; EM 190). The ontological argument shows us the essential task of philosophy, “that of bringing to light certain fundamental assumptions that govern our experience, whether religious, scientific or historical” (77). D’Oro claims that the radical-conversion theorists ignore a difference between a sociology of knowledge and Collingwood’s descriptive metaphysics. Collingwood repeatedly claims that the subject-matter of philosophy is explanatorily rather than metaphysically necessary, even if he does couch it in different words in different books (84-5). What the ontological proof really shows is that the only kinds of necessary propositions are those which are “definitive of domains of inquiry.” Philosophy, identified with these definitions of domains of inquiry, is a normative task which is indeed concerned with the notion of justification and the idea of comparing knowledge claims across time.

The radical-conversion theorists claim the opposite, however. Alan Donagan, for one, has called Collingwood’s project in EM a “depth psychology,” by which he means in part that justification has been abandoned in favor of an inquiry into the origins of belief (88). Donagan argues that all Collingwood cares about is finding out what “beliefs people are compelled to hold not on account of nature (as Hume claimed) but of history” (91). But Collingwood was interested in the justifications of our beliefs and was interested in them from the standpoint of Kantian-style transcendental arguments, which “compel us to accept certain conclusions as a matter of logic” (93). Transcendental arguments are . priori, but they differ from deductive arguments because their “premises are validated through the process of argument [unlike deductive arguments] and have no independent justification [but] … establish certain conclusions by accepting the interdependence of beliefs and the circularity of knowledge claims” (93-4). Collingwood claims that presuppositions have ’logical efficacy,’ (EM 27), by which he means that they give rise to questions. Whereas differences in relative presuppositions “give rise to different questions within the same mode of inquiry, differences in absolute presuppositions give rise to differences in modes of inquiry” (96). Thus far, D’Oro has convincingly claimed mainly that (1) Collingwood’s metaphysics is about “what we are logically committed to believe, rather than what we actually believe,” and (2) that Collingwood was trying to save metaphysics from the onslaught of the logical positivists and thus employed a terminology that they would understand (99). Absolute presuppositions make experience possible, so even though they are empirically unverifiable, they are very meaningful. The logic of question and answer utilizes justification because it attempts to show us what we “ought to believe,” not just what we do in fact believe.

Chapter Eight, the longest chapter in the book, shows how The Idea of History is concerned with distinguishing between the domains of inquiry of historians and natural scientists, thus demonstrating how absolute presuppositions can help us to identify different modes of inquiry. For Collingwood historical knowledge explains “what occurs as an expression of rational processes rather than as a manifestation of empirical laws” (105). One of the absolute presuppositions of historians is that “the real is rational,” not in the Hegelian sense, “but in the sense that only what can be interpreted rationally is real (i.e. an appropriate subject matter) for historians” (107). The historian’s emphasis on rational processes is brought to light in the concept of action, which is opposed to the scientist’s concern with an ’event,’ the result of natural necessity (108). D’Oro connects this discussion with Collingwood’s infamous theory of re-enactment expressed in IH. According to this theory, actions have an inner, thought dimension which events lack and which historians must attempt to re-enact in their own minds. The theory has been criticized for endorsing private mental states and thus investing historians “with telepathic powers of access” (110). But such critics are wrong, argues D’Oro, even though Collingwood begs for such criticism with his sloppy use of language in IH. The . priori logic of the historian is what the critics ignore. The historian explains an action not by a Humean constant conjunction, but by reconstructing “a practical syllogism in which the agent’s beliefs and desires stand to the action as the premises of a deductive argument stand to the conclusion” (110). In EM this idea is presented more directly, without the possible psychologistic reading inspired by the “inside/outside” distinction used in IH.

Collingwood’s philosophy of history has been called overly intellectualistic, since not all human actions are rational. But Collingwood simply wants to delineate the domain of history, and non-rational actions, while they certainly exist, are not part of the narrow definition of ’action’ presupposed by historians. And when Collingwood defines actions as ’expressions of thought,’ “he is simply unpacking the concept of action, he is not making a claim about the extension of the concept” (114). It has also been claimed that Collingwood ignores non-rational conditions that affect behavior. In one oft-criticized passage, he writes that a poor person’s actions cannot be determined by “the fact of his children’s unsatisfied hunger, the fact, the physiological fact, of empty bellies and wizened limbs, but his thought of that fact” (IH 315-6; 114). D’Oro defends Collingwood here by saying that he is committed to the idea that “if objective or material conditions are overwhelming, there simply cannot be a history of thought” (114). The statement that ’All history is a history of thought’ must be appreciated in the light of the task of IH—to delineate the domain of historical inquiry. Chapter Eight closes by discussing Collingwood’s critique of the ’scissors-and-paste’ historian, who essentially does history by “repeating statements that other people have made before him” (116;IH 274). This approach to history fails because it classifies across categories. The task of a philosophy of history, according to Collingwood, “is not to show historians how to acquire knowledge of the past, but to clarify what the subject matter of history is by bringing to light the . priori principles or categories that guide historians …” (124).

The final two chapters further clarify the importance of history for philosophy. History is the study of mind because it presupposes the idea of an ’action,’, which involves studying and re-enacting thought. Since thought has no spatio-temporality, the historian and the historical agent can have one and the same thought. This holds true because mentalistic explanations are teleological— “they are concerned with the relationship between logical ground and consequent rather than with the relationship between temporal antecedent and consequent” (130). Historians thus attempt to use explanation and justification at the same time; they “connect the explanandum with the explanans in the way in which a detective seeks to unmask a crime by looking for motives …,” not by looking for causes of an ’event’ (132). History, as the science of mind writ large, is criteriological, presupposes rationality, and is opposed to natural science, which is the science of the body. Collingwood’s anti-realism and his anti-naturalism are “the result of his commitment to transcendentals” (135). He defends the autonomy of the mental only because he presents metaphysics as “concerned with the kind of concepts and conceptual distinctions that cannot be empirically observed but which nonetheless structure … [ experience]” (138).

For Collingwood method determines subject matter, and “there is no ontology that is ultimate or more basic” (138). The mind-body problem is very real, but Collingwood says that the problem is identified by the collision of the sciences of the mind with the sciences of the body. This kind of problem is both persistent and particular to philosophy, which tackles “problems that arise when concepts applicable in the different domains of inquiry begin to interfere with each other” (141). Philosophical problems are conceptual and are resolved . priori, by reflecting on experience, not by accumulating new empirical data (141). Collingwood thus upholds the importance of philosophy and explains the perennial nature of philosophical problems with his reformed metaphysics.

The only weakness of the book is, ironically, its treatment of the pragmatists. To say that the pragmatists reject the correspondence theory of truth and hope for a non-normative discourse is shortsighted at best. M. Adler, in Six Great Ideas, puts it succinctly and well when he states that James’ pragmatism was not a new definition of truth, but “accepted the traditional so-called correspondence theory of truth and proceeded to offer useful indications or criteria for determining whether a given statement was true or false” (SGI 213). To take it even further, I personally hope someone can meet Mink’s decades-old challenge—not yet attempted let alone met, as far as I know—to prove Collingwood part of the same philosophical stream as both the pragmatists and the existentialists. Mink says that Collingwood matches the two movements in their relevance to the problematic human condition and that Collingwood and they have offered “ not merely expressions of it but proposals of ways of thinking about it” (MHD 7). As parting evidence that Collingwood’s connection to the pragmatists needs closer attention, here is a passage from Dewey, which could easily be inserted into EM: “Failure to examine the conceptual structures and frames of reference which are unconsciously implicated in even the seemingly most factual inquiries is the greatest single defect that can be found in any field of inquiry” (MHD 9).

The pragmatists aside, D’Oro does a fine job of outlining what is undoubtedly the major point of Collingwood’s collected work—the merging of philosophy and history (Collingwood sometimes uses the word rapprochement to describe this merger). Collingwood reforms metaphysics into an historical, criteriological science and holds it as the highest form of philosophical achievement possible. There are larger books on this subject, but their size is due to the fact that they try to integrate all of Collingwood’s major works in arguing for or against his overall project. This small book almost completely ignores Speculum Mentis, Principles of Art, The Idea of Nature, and New Leviathan. But the text does not suffer from its conciseness. D’Oro has proven Collingwood’s great debt to Kantian transcendentalism, with its yin and yang trappings of rationalism and conceptualism—but not historicism. Unlike Mink and Rubinoff, D’Oro never once uses the word ’dialectic’ and, unlike theirs and other longer works, she eschews much of the comprehensive polemics of the “radical conversion” and delves mainly into EPM and EM to find Collingwood’s continuity. There is nary a single negative judgment made of Collingwood, but then she understood her task as one of defense or apology. Collingwood is important, and this brief, lucid book tells us so again by reconstructing his Kantian roots.