Color Ontology and Color Science

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Jonathan Cohen and Mohan Matthen (eds.), Color Ontology and Color Science, MIT Press, 2010, 419pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262513753.

Reviewed by Berit Brogaard, University of Missouri, St. Louis


This is an overall excellent collection of papers concerning the ontology and science of color. The contributors include some significant names in contemporary color research. Besides the editors themselves, the authors are Rolf G. Kuehni, Paul Churchland, Reinhard Niederée, Rainer Mausfeld, Donald I. A. MacLeod, Kimberly A. Jameson, Austen Clark, Jonathan Westphal, Alex Byrne, David R. Hilbert and Justin Broackes.

The twelve articles are opinion pieces on the structure of color space, the nature of color and color blindness. One could have wished for a slightly broader coverage of current color research and philosophical theories of color. For example, there is little here specifically about cortical color processing, achromatopsia, color synesthesia, color illusions and top-down influences on color perception, and there is little discussion of color primitivism, color dispositionalism and color eliminativism. But the volume is bound to spark lively debate and is worth reading for the quality of its contributions alone.

As the editors point out in their introduction, one theme that can be seen to unify the different contributions is their position on the status of 'traditional color space' (TCS). TCS is a representation of how humans perceive colors developed by Leo M. Hurvich and Dorothea Jameson (1955). This new representation of colors replaced Newton's rainbow hue circle, which represents the wavelength of light rather than how colors are perceived (see Figure 1).












                                                   Figure 1: Newton's Hue Circle


Unlike Newton's hue circle, Hurvich and Jameson's color space is based on how light is processed in the photoreceptor cells, or cones, in the human eye and in the opponent cells in the early visual system. The normal human eye has three cone types: L, M and S. L cones are receptive to light in the red end of the color spectrum, M cones are receptive to green light and S cones are receptive to blue light. The output from these cells is processed in L-M (red-green) and L-M-S (yellow-blue) opponent channels. The output from these channels ultimately gives rise to the unique hues (blue, green, yellow, red) and the mixed hues (e.g., orange and brown). However, the perceived output can change significantly as the brain adjusts for, for instance, differences in illumination conditions and memory associations between color and shape.

One of Hurvich and Jameson's major insights was that there is not a one-one correspondence between color of light and perceived color. Wavelengths in different parts of the color spectrum can give rise to the same perceived color (see Figure 2).



                    Figure 2: A representation of subject J's perception of the unique hues.


Larry Hardin was the one to introduce Hurvich and Jameson's color space, or traditional color space (TCS), to philosophers. He argued that, unlike Newton's color wheel, TCS is purely a reflection of how colors are experienced and has no objective ground in the world. For example, as shown in Figure 2, several distinct ranges of wavelength are experienced as red by subject J. So colors could not be wavelengths or ranges of wavelengths emitted by the objects, nor could they be the underlying powers or structures of the objects said to possess the colors in question.

Hardin's position is also known as 'irrealism', 'eliminativism' or 'subjectivism'. It stands in stark contrast to color physicalism, which takes the colors to be physical features of objects, for example, equivalence classes of surface spectral reflectance properties (Byrne and Hilbert 2003).

One problem facing color physicalism is to explain the relation between physical and perceived colors. A simple response to this challenge would be to say that the physical colors are equivalence classes of those surface-spectral reflectance properties that give rise to the perceived color; for example, red may be taken to be the class of surface-spectral reflectance properties that give rise to perceived red (Byrne and Hilbert 2003). One problem with this sort of response is that it seems to take the perceived colors to be more fundamental than the physical features themselves.

In his contribution to this volume, Churchland provides an alternative physicalist account of color intended to overcome this sort of problem. His suggestion is that physical colors and perceived colors are related by their CA ellipse. A CA ellipse is a transformation of a standard color spectrum chart that represents wavelengths along the x-axis and reflectance efficiency along the y-axis. The transformation proceeds as follows: '[you] roll [the color spectrum] into a cylinder so that its right-most vertical edge makes a snug contact with its left-most vertical edge. A planar cut through the cylinder produces an elliptical shape (see Figure 3). This is the CA ellipse.












Figure 3: a. Color spectrum chart representing a "common sense" color. b. Planar cut through a cylinder, or a "CE ellipse", the physical feature that unites all metamers (adapted from Churchland 2010)


The cut that best approximates the graph that represents reflectance efficiency for each wavelength in the original color spectrum is representative of the color seen. According to Churchland, metamers, that is, colors that we cannot distinguish but that correspond to different ranges of the color spectrum, have very similar CA ellipses. The CA ellipses, Churchland says, are the physical feature that unites all metamers. One wonders, though, whether this really is a physical feature or an ingenious representation of how the human visual system responds to particular reflectance profiles.

In "Color Experience: A Semantic Theory," Matthen takes issue with a range of realist theories of color, including physicalism, on the basis of the plausible assumption that we can know various color relations with Cartesian certainty; for example, we know with certainty that red is more similar to orange than to blue. According to Matthen, dispositionalism, relationalism, physicalism and most other philosophical and scientific theories of color cannot explain why truths about color relations are 'quasi-analytic'. Matthen suggests a different picture of what colors are. For him, TCS is a representation of how our vision divides objects into colors. The theory he proposes is a semantic theory, a form of projectivism, according to which the relationship between color and color perception is semantic: the colors are properties represented by our color experiences.

In her piece "Where in the World Color Survey is the Support for the Hering Primaries as the Basis for Color Categorization?" Kimberly A. Jameson disputes the assumption that TCS is a result of universal perceptual mechanisms. She attributes the strong adherence to the idea of universal color categorization principles to Hering's opponent-colors theory, according to which 'unique hues are defined as those hues that are phenomenologically pure or unmixed in quality: thus unique green is that green that appears neither bluish nor yellowish' (p. 190). The argument usually offered in favor of this theory is that these unique hues have a 'high subjective salience' and 'are necessary and sufficient descriptors of all visible colors'. This argument, she says, fails to take into account individual and cultural variance in color perception. Data show that what one individual perceives as a clear instance of red, another individual will see as an instance of orange (Malkoc et al. 2005). The fact that different individuals perceive colors differently does not challenge the assumption that there is a universal color space, but it does cast doubt on the universality of color position in color space as well as the idea that a universal color space is a reflection of how vision processes color.

Individual variation in color perception also provides the foundation for Cohen's argument for color relationalism, both in his contribution to this volume and in his (2009) monograph The Red and the Real. According to color relationalism, the colors are relational properties that integrate perceivers and viewing conditions (Cohen 2009). No object is simply red, though it may be red-relative to-me-and-my-current-viewing-condition. Though we normally use non-relativized color terms, Cohen's view does not entail a widespread error-theory about color discourse. For, it is assumed that there are tacit argument places for perceivers and viewing conditions in the sentence structure of color attribution sentences, which get filled in context. My utterance of the sentence 'tomatoes are red' in circumstance C has the content of 'tomatoes are red-relative-to-me-in-viewing-conditions-C', and John's utterance of the sentence 'tomatoes are red' in viewing conditions C has the content of 'tomatoes are red-relative-to- John-in-viewing-conditions-C'. After laying out his view, Cohen argues that, unlike physicalism, color relationalism easily accommodates variation in how we perceive colors. At the end of the chapter, he addresses the concern that relationalism doesn't provide an objective and unified theory of color.

Byrne and Hilbert argue for a revised version of a view they call the 'reduction view' of color blindness. According to this view, the color space of red-green colorblind individuals (dichromats) is a proper part of that of normal individuals (TCS). They contrast the reduction view with the 'alien view', according to which the color space of red-green dichromats is completely different from that of trichromats. Their argument rests on the idea that the color space of trichromats is based on how light is processed in two types of opponent channels: red-green and yellow-blue. The input to the red-green channel is a function of the output of the L and M cones in the retina and the input to the yellow-blue channel is a function of the output of L, M, and S cones. Colorblind individuals either have defects to their M cones or defects to their L cones. They do not have any defects to their S cones. So their blue-yellow channel should be functional. So the colors they experience ought to be located in normal color space. However, colorblind individuals do not see exactly the same colors as normal trichromats. As the input to the yellow-blue channel is the output of L, M and S cones and they have defects to either the M cones or the L cones, the colors they experience are untainted with either red or green. So they see not just blue and yellow but super-blue and super-yellow.

Broackes's contribution also addresses the question of whether the colors colorblind individuals perceive can be properly located in TCS. Broackes criticizes the view that that TCS is constructed out of cone inputs, as suggested by Byrne and Hilbert. Broackes's view is neither a reduction nor an alien view. He believes that all human perceivers, including dichromats, are capable of representing the world via TCS. The difference between dichromats and trichromats is that the trichromats have more information available for distinguishing the different colors in TCS than dichromats do. Dichromats nonetheless are sometimes able to distinguish red and green and don't lack concepts of these colors. Even dichromats who have completely nonfunctional L or M cones can still gather information about colors that normally are the result of outputs from these cones. He suggests that colorblind individuals can gather this information via enhanced input to the other cones and an ability to deduce the colors of objects from other cues in the environment, for example, the different ways the different colors darken in dim light.

Unfortunately, limitations of space preclude further detailed comment on individual contributions to this volume. The remaining contributions include Kuehni's "Color Spaces and Color Order Systems: A Primer", Niederée's "More Than Three Dimensions: What Continuity Considerations Can Tell Us about Perceived Color", Mausfeld's "Color within an Internalist Framework: The Role of 'Color' in the Structure of the Perceptual System", MacLeod's "Into the Neural Maze", Clark's "Color, Qualia and Attention: A Nonstandard Interpretation" and Westphal's "How can the Logic of Color Concepts Apply to Afterimage Colors?". Though there is no doubt that every essayist is a first-rate color researcher, one cannot help but notice that there is only one female contributor to the volume. The editors could, in my opinion, have done a better job trying to recruit female contributors from the extensive list of women working in this and related areas.[1] That said, the quality of the contributions to this collection is high, and most of the articles do an excellent job of providing high levels of informativeness as well as accessibility.

All in all, Color Ontology and Color Science is a rich and stimulating collection, which no doubt will become an invaluable resource for graduate students and researchers working on color and color perception.[2]


Byrne, A and Hilbert D. R. (2003). "Color Realism and Color Science". Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 26: 3-21.

Cohen, J (2009). The Red and the Real, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hurvich, LM and Jameson, D (1955). "Some Quantitative Aspects of an Opponent-Colors Theory. II. Brightness, Saturation, and Hue in Normal and Dichromatic Vision," J. Opt. Soc. Am. 45: 602-616.

Malkoc, G., P. Kay, and Webster, M.A. (2005). "Variations in Normal Color Vision. IV. Binary Hues and Hue Scaling". Journal of the Optical Society of America, A 22, 2154-2168.

[1] For a continually updated list of women working in philosophy of mind and closely cognate fields, see the list compiled by Berit Brogaard, Carolyn Dicey-Jennings, and John Schwenkler. 

[2] Thanks to Mohan Matthen for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.