Combining Minds: How to Think about Composite Subjectivity

Combining Minds How To Think About Composite Subjectivity Book Cover

Luke Roelofs, Combining Minds: How to Think about Composite Subjectivity, Oxford University Press, 2019, 336pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190859053.

Reviewed by Eric Schwitzgebel, University of California, Riverside


Panpsychism is trending. If you're not a panpsychist, you might find this puzzling. According to panpsychism, consciousness is ubiquitous. Even solitary elementary particles have or participate in it. This view might seem patently absurd -- as obviously false a philosophical view as you're likely to encounter. So why are so many excellent philosophers suddenly embracing it?[1] If you read Luke Roelofs' book, you will probably not become a panpsychist, but at least you will understand.

Panpsychism, especially in Roelofs' hands, has the advantage of directly confronting two huge puzzles about consciousness that are relatively neglected by non-panpsychists. And panpsychism's biggest apparent downside, its incredible bizarreness (by the standards of ordinary common sense in our current culture), might not be quite as bad a flaw as it seems. I will introduce the puzzles and sketch Roelofs' answers, then discuss the overall argumentative structure of the book. I will conclude by discussing the daunting bizarreness.

Let me note: Although panpsychism is the topic of the first half of the book, in the second half Roelofs explores mental combination from a mix of panpsychist and non-panpsychist perspectives.

1. The Continuity Problem

Most of us (early 21st century readers of academic Anglophone philosophy) are committed to two ideas about consciousness which strain against each other. The first is that consciousness, and conscious subjects, and streams of experience, and persons, are discrete and countable. You either have zero experiencers, or one, or two, or more -- some whole number. We don't normally imagine that an entity could be one-eighth conscious or that there could be 1.75 subjects of experience here in this room. The second idea is that the grounds or bases of consciousness -- the biological, functional, or informational phenomena that give rise to experience -- are continuous, admitting of degrees. Once conceptualized in this way, the problem is immediately evident and so also, probably, is the space of possible answers.

Consider a case of consciousness merging -- one way of "combining minds". (This case is simplified from Roelofs' Chapter 8.) On the right we have Mind 1, on the left Mind 2. Bit by bit in stages arbitrarily small, we connect them. At the end, possibly months later, we have a single integrated mind -- maybe molecule for molecule indistinguishable from an ordinary, single, integrated mind. At some point, it seems, the two minds must have become one. If they did so suddenly, then we have the challenge of explaining a sudden metaphysical saltation across what we can seemingly construct as an arbitrarily smooth gradation. If they did so gradually, then there must have been a phase during which there was either an indeterminate or an intermediate number of minds (one and a half?). But how can we make sense of that? Of course, we could build the conceptual equipment to make sense of this, but we don't have such equipment yet and puzzles leap quickly into view: What do we say about death? Rights? The supposed unity of consciousness and privileges of introspection?

Roelofs' solution is elegant, promiscuous, and bizarre. Every possible combination of things already is a subject of experience, though most subjects of experience are not functionally integrated or capable of reflective self-knowledge. We didn't go from two minds to one. Rather, there were already vastly many minds! What changed was just the degree of integration among some of them. Compare the promiscuous ontology of objects which some metaphysicians employ to solve puzzles about scattered objects, object boundaries, and the ontology of parts and wholes. According to promiscuous object ontology, every arbitrary collection of entities is already an object -- all the spin up electrons in this room, for example, and the aggregate of my left shoe and Jupiter. Roelofs' view of subjects of conscious experience is similar. Now if you think that minds must have certain properties, like functional integration or a capacity for reflective consciousness, you're not going to accept this promiscuous solution. But if you're willing to forgo those commitments, and if you're not allergic to the resultant panpsychism, you can avoid unpleasant metaphysical saltations and certain weird indeterminacies.

Although Roelofs' preferred solution to this puzzle is promiscuous panpsychism, Roelofs also explores how merging might work on a more standard functionalist picture, according to which mentality requires functional capacities integrated to some degree. Indeterminacy (alternatively, intermediacy or saltation) won't be entirely avoidable on any approach if you're interested not just in counting subjects in Roelofs' thin, promiscuous sense but in counting functionally coherent persons or subjects or loci of mentality. Derek Parfit (1984) famously worked through wild thought experiments that challenge our ordinary conception of persons as discrete and countable. Although Parfit's work profoundly influenced subsequent work on the metaphysics of personal identity, few philosophers of mind have explored, with Roelofs' open-mindedness and precision, the extent to which the same puzzles threaten to disrupt mainstream approaches to consciousness.

Roelofs' book vividly confronts these issues and rigorously begins to describe the theoretical options.

2. The Nesting Problem

In 2016, Tomer Fekete, Cees Van Leeuwen, and Shimon Edelman articulated a general problem for computational theories of consciousness, which they called the Boundary Problem. The problem extends to most mainstream functional or biological theories of consciousness, and I will call it the Nesting Problem. Consider your favorite functional, biological, informational, or computational criterion of consciousness, criterion C, such that when a system has C, that system is conscious. Maybe C involves having a certain kind of intelligent reactivity to inputs, or maybe C involves structured meta-representations of a certain sort, or whatever. Unless you possess a fairly unusual and specific theory, probably the following will be true: Not only the whole animal (alternatively, the whole brain) will meet criterion C. So also will some subparts of the animal and some larger systems to which the animal belongs. If there are relatively functionally isolated cognitive processes, for example, they will also have inputs and outputs, and integrate information, and maybe have a certain type of self-monitoring. Arguably, also groups of people organized as companies or nations receive group-level inputs, engage in group-level information processing and self-representation, and act collectively. These groups might also meet criterion C.[2]

Various puzzles, or problems, or at least questions immediately follow, which few mainstream theorists of consciousness have engaged seriously and in detail.[3] First: Are all these subsystems and groups conscious? If so, how does their consciousness relate to consciousness at the animal level? Is there, for example, a stream of experience in the visual cortex, or in the enteric nervous system, that is distinct from the stream of experience of the animal as a whole? Second: If we want to attribute consciousness just to the animal (alternatively, whole brain) and not to its subsystems or to groups, on what grounds do we justify denying consciousness to subsystems or groups? For many theories, this will require adjustment to or at least refinement of criterion C or alternatively the defense of a general "exclusion postulate" (Oizumi, Albantakis, and Tononi 2014) or "anti-nesting principle" (Kammerer 2015) which specifically forbids nesting levels of consciousness.

The great exception to the neglect of this issue among theorists of consciousness is the panpsychists, who generally treat what they call the Combination Problem as among the central challenges to panpsychism. (See Chalmers 2016 for a review.) For the panpsychist who holds that even electrons can be conscious, the Combination Problem is the problem of explaining how all the particles that make up your mind could generate the single stream of complex conscious experience that you seem to introspect rather than remaining only a myriad of simple and separate experiences. It is a challenging problem for panpsychists! But if they can solve this problem, they also thereby solve the Nesting Problem, giving them a certain theoretical advantage over mainstream theorists of consciousness who have mostly not yet begun to squarely confront the difficulty.

Roelofs' solution is again elegant and bizarre. They suggest that consciousness combines in roughly the same way mass combines. There is no problem with the fact that you weigh 70 kilos and your brain 1.5 kilos and some subpart of your brain 0.1 kilos and an electron in your brain 9 x 10-31 kilos. Each has its own mass and their masses combine to constitute the mass of the larger objects they compose. So also, Roelofs argues, each particle that composes you has its own consciousness, and each of your larger subparts also has its own consciousness, and all of these combine to form your consciousness as a whole. Consciousness at one level does not exclude consciousness at another, but neither are consciousnesses at different levels distinct from each other. You don't notice the specific conscious experiences of the electrons in your brain or the skin cells in your knee because they contribute only "confusedly" to the whole and/or there isn't the right kind of functional organization for precise introspective tracking.

3. The Structure of Combining Minds

In Chapter 1, Roelofs motivates panpsychism and defines some central terms, including combinationism. According to combinationism, "the experiential properties of a conscious subject are sometimes mere combinations of the experiential properties of other subjects which compose it" (p. 6). In other words, conscious subjects "nest" in the sense discussed in Section 2 of this review, and they nest such that a larger entity's experiences can sometimes be nothing over and above the experiences of smaller subjects of which it is composed.

Chapter 2 is dedicated to rebutting five arguments against combinationism. For example, one might attempt to argue against combinationism by appealing to the "privacy" of conscious experiences, a principle according to which any one (token) experience can belong to only one subject. Token experiences cannot be shared. Intuitively, there's some attraction to the idea of privacy: My experiences are mine. Yours are yours. Even if we have qualitatively identical experiences -- experiences of the exact same shade of red, say, spreading out across the exact same perspectivally-defined apparent spatial region -- the experiences are ontologically distinct. (Compare taking "the same" car to work when we each take a separate 2009 Honda Accord versus when we carpool.) Viewed in this way, it can seem like a plausible metaphysical principle that no two subjects of experience could ever share the same token experience. Roelofs responds not by decisively refuting privacy but by suggesting, plausibly in my view, that once we start to think seriously about the possibility of overlapping subjects -- subjects who maybe share a brain region -- privacy is no longer as compelling as when we consider only non-overlapping subjects.[4] In a similar manner, Roelofs shows that other in-principle metaphysical objections to combinationism rely on assumptions that scholars attracted to combinationism might reasonably reject.

In Chapters 3 and 4, Roelofs details how combinationism plays out for his preferred version of panpsychism, "constitutive Russellian panpsychism", according to which fundamental physical things (electrons, or whatever) are conscious "microsubjects" whose fundamental physical properties and relations correspond with their experiential properties and relations. Marrying combinationism with this species of panpsychism yields Roelofs' preferred picture: Human consciousness arises from the combination of the conscious experiences of microsubjects.

What is it like to be an electron? It will be simple, on Roelofs' view. It might involve, for example, the experience of "something" outside that motivates one to move sightlessly toward or away, a "maximally unspecific, mere inchoate gesturing" (p. 78). Such simple experiences combine according to two fundamental principles. One principle is the Micro-Unity Hypothesis: "one, some, or all of the fundamental physical relations is [such that] when two microsubjects are related in the relevant way, their experiences become unified, establishing a composite experience that subsumes them" (p. 80). The other is Experience Inheritance, according to which "whenever a part of aggregate x undergoes an experience . . . x undergoes that same experience" (p. 79). A "small palette" of simple experiences of fundamental particles "blends" into the complexity of human experience. If it seems otherwise, that's due to functional limitations in introspection and the fact that many microexperiences are inextricably "confused" together.

Throughout, Roelofs' approach is programmatic and defensive. Their aim is not to commit to a detailed, specific account. Rather the project is to defuse likely objections and show panpsychist combinationism to be a coherent package with some attractive theoretical virtues.

In Chapters 5 and 6, Roelofs explores combination and composite subjectivity while bracketing commitment to panpsychism, illustrating how some issues play out on more standard functionalist views as well as on panpsychist views. Here Roelofs confronts what I have called the Nesting Problem in its more general form. Roelofs articulates a principle of Conditional Experience Inheritance, which is a relative of Experience Inheritance, mentioned earlier. This principle is too complicated to explicate in a short review, but it addresses Nesting by plausibly suggesting that wholes will inherit the experiences of their parts when the functional relationships are right. The experience of the whole is (under the right conditions) built from the experience of the parts. However, when the whole is structurally diffuse, as is perhaps the case with companies and nations, consciousness is either absent (on the non-panpsychist view that some threshold of integration or group-level functionality is required but not met) or it is present but highly indeterminate due to the blending of many individuals' different conflicting experiences without much coordinated functioning.

Chapter 6 also shows how Roelofs' approach can address questions about "split brain" commissurotomy patients in a manner that attractively (and Parfit-like) avoids sharp-boundaried counting. On Roelofs' picture, high-level subjects aren't fundamental. There's some unity, there's some disunity, and a bright-line answer is unnecessary -- in contrast to views on which subjects are always only a small number of high-level discrete wholes. Here is some of the payoff of Roelofs' picture: a resolution of the Continuity Problem without saltation.

Chapter 7 explores personal identity from a similar perspective. Chapter 8 is a detailed treatment of slow merging, as I discussed in simplified form in Section 2 of this review. Chapter 9 concludes.

4. The Incredible Bizarreness of Panpsychism

The book explores the architecture of panpsychism in impressive detail, especially the difficulties around combination. Roelofs' arguments are clear and rigorously laid out. Roelofs fairly acknowledges difficulties and objections, often presenting more than one response, resulting in a suite of possible related views rather than a single definitively supported view. The book is a trove of intricate, careful, intellectually honest metaphysics.

Nevertheless, the reader might simply find panpsychism too bizarre to accept. It would not be unreasonable to feel more confident that electrons aren't conscious than that any clever philosophical argument to the contrary is sound. No philosophical argument in the vicinity will have the nearly irresistible power of a mathematical proof or compelling series of scientific experiments. Big picture, broad scope, general theories of consciousness always depend upon weighing plausibilities against each other. So if a philosophical argument implies that electrons are conscious, you might reasonably reject the argument rather than accept the conclusion. You might find panpsychism just too profoundly implausible.

That is my own position, I suppose. I can't decisively refute panpsychism by pointing to some particle and saying "obviously, that's not conscious!" any more than Samuel Johnson could refute Berkeleyan metaphysical idealism by kicking a stone. Still, panpsychism (and Berkeleyan idealism) conflicts too sharply with my default philosophical starting points for me to be convinceable by anything short of an airtight proof of the sort it's unrealistic to expect in this domain. Yes, of course, as the history of science amply shows, our ordinary default commonsense understanding isn't always correct! But we must start somewhere, and it is reasonable to demand compelling grounds before abandoning those starting points that feel, to you, to be among the firmest.

Still, I don't think we should feel entirely confident or comfortable taking this stand. If there's one thing we know about the metaphysics of consciousness, it is that something bizarre must be true. Among the reasons to think so: Every well-developed theory of consciousness in the entire history of written philosophy on Earth has either been radically bizarre on its face or had radically bizarre consequences.[5] This includes dualist theories like those of Descartes (who notoriously denied animal consciousness) and "common sense" philosopher Thomas Reid (who argued that material objects can't cause anything or even cohere into stable shapes without the constant intervention of immaterial souls) as well as materialist or physicalist theories of the sort that have dominated Anglophone philosophy since the 1960s (which typically involve either commitment to attributing consciousness to strange assemblages, or denial of local supervenience, or both, and which seem to leave common sense farther behind the more specific they become). If no non-bizarre general theory of consciousness is available, or even (I suspect) constructible in principle, then we should be wary of treating bizarreness alone as sufficient grounds to reject a theory.

How sparse or abundant is consciousness in the universe? This is among the most central cosmological questions we can ask. A universe rich with conscious entities is very different from one in which conscious experience requires a rare confluence of unlikely events. Currently, theories run the full spectrum from the radical abundance of panpsychism to highly restrictive theories that raise doubts about whether even other mammals are conscious (e.g., Dennett 1996; Carruthers 2019). Various strange cases, like hypothetical robots and aliens, introduce further theoretical variation. Across an amazingly wide range of options, we can find theories that are coherent, defensible against the most obvious objections, and reconcilable with current empirical science. All theories -- unavoidably, it seems -- have some commitments that most of us will find bizarre and difficult to believe. The most appropriate response to all of this is, I think, doubt and wonder. In doubtful and wondrous mood, we might reasonably set aside a sliver of credence space for panpsychism.


Carruthers, Peter (2019). Human and Animal Minds. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, David J. (1996). The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, David J. (2016). The combination problem for panpsychism. In G. Brüntrup and L. Jaskolla, eds., Panpsychism. New York: Oxford University Press.

Dennett, Daniel C. (1996). Kinds of Minds. New York: Basic Books.

Fekete, Tomer, Cees van Leeuwen, and Shimon Edelman (2016). System, subsystem, hive: Boundary problems in computational theories of consciousness. Frontiers in Psychology, 7, 01041.

Goff, Philip (2017). Consciousness and Fundamental Reality. New York: Oxford University Press.

Kammerer, François (2015). How a materialist can deny that the United States is probably conscious -- response to Schwitzgebel. Philosophia, 43, 1047-1057.

Oizumi, Masafumi, Larissa Albantakis, and Giulio Tononi (2014). From the phenomenology to the mechanisms of consciousness: Integrated Information Theory 3.0. PLoS: Computational Biology, 10 (5), e1003588.

Parfit, Derek (1984). Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schwitzgebel, Eric (2014a). The crazyist metaphysics of mind. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 92, 665-682.

Schwitzgebel, Eric (2014b). Tononi's exclusion postulate would make consciousness (nearly) irrelevant. Blog post at The Splintered Mind (July 16): http:

Schwitzgebel, Eric (2015). If materialism is true, the United States is probably conscious. Philosophical Studies, 172, 1697-1721.

Shaviro, Steven (2014). The Universe of Things. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.

Strawson, Galen (2006). Consciousness and Its Place in Nature. Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic.

Tononi, Giulio, and Christof Koch (2015). Consciousness: Here, there and everywhere? Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B, 370, 20140167.


[1] Among prominent recent advocates are Galen Strawson (Strawson 2006), Philip Goff (2017), and (albeit tentatively) David Chalmers (1996, 2016). In neuroscience, Giulio Tononi's Integrated Information Theory comes close to panpsychism (Oizumi, Albantakis, and Tononi 2014; Tononi and Koch 2015). The view is also gaining currency among "Continental" philosophers (e.g., Shaviro 2014).

[2] For an extended argument that the United States, conceived of as a concrete entity with people as parts, meets most standard materialist criteria for being a conscious entity, see Schwitzgebel 2015.

[3] Giulio Tononi is an important exception (e.g., in Oizumi, Albantakis, and Tononi 2014). The strangeness of the views he consequently endorses illustrates the difficulty of the issues. See discussion in Schwitzgebel 2014b.

[4] A real-life case of subjects who overlap by sharing some brain regions might be craniopagus twins, joined at the head. See the fascinating case of Krista and Tatiana Hogan as portrayed in the 2017 CBC documentary Inseparable: Ten Years Joined at the Head.

[5] Schwitzgebel 2014a defends this thesis in detail.