Commentary on Plato's Timaeus: Volume III, Book 3, Part I [Proclus on the World's Body]

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Proclus, Commentary on Plato's Timaeus: Volume III, Book 3, Part I [Proclus on the World's Body], Dirk Baltzly (ed., trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2007, 205pp., $91.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521845953.

Reviewed by Sara Ahbel-Rappe, University of Michigan


The entire range of living matter on Earth from whales to viruses and from oaks to algae could be regarded as constituting a single living entity capable of maintaining the Earth's atmosphere to suit its overall needs and endowed with faculties and powers far beyond those of its constituent parts.

-- James Lovelock, Gaia: A New Look at Life on Earth

Perhaps the fifth century Platonist philosopher Proclus would be pleased to learn that after fifteen hundred years, the Gaia hypothesis is still with us and that philosophers today wrestle, as Proclus did, with competing orders of explanation for natural phenomena, ranging from the highly suspect teleology to respectable emergence. No doubt he would be surprised to find the hypothesis, which in its strongest modern formulation posits that living systems on earth actively create conditions favorable to themselves, called 'new’. Volume III of Proclus' Commentary on Plato's Timaeus, Proclus on the World's Body, might well be taken as a precursor of Lovelock's work.[1] In it, Proclus, while commenting on Timaeus 31a-34a8, works through the meaning of natural philosophy, attempting to address the ecology of the earth's living systems within a plurality of intellectual viewpoints, from Aristotelian science to Neoplatonist metaphysics. Dirk Baltzly, the editor and translator, does a fine job of explaining this material, which ranges from the elementary to the abstruse, to the reader unacquainted with Greek science and mathematics.

To situate the Commentary in the milieu in which it was written, two things are necessary. First, we must appreciate the place of the dialogue in the Neoplatonic curriculum. The Timaeus was read at the pinnacle of the student's career in Proclus' Academy, followed only by the Parmenides. The reader of Proclus' text was at a highly advanced point in his studies, having already mastered the works of Aristotle, and having completed coursework in astronomy, mathematics, and music. Next, we must appreciate the skopos, the aim of the dialogue, as Proclus and his fellow commentators understood it.[2] As Tarrant writes in the Introduction to Volume I, in approaching a work of Plato, the goal of the Neoplatonist was not 'knowledge' in the sense that we might understand scientific knowledge but theoria, by which Iamblichus and Proclus apparently meant epiphany; the study of the Gorgias culminates in a vision of the Demiurge, whereas the study of the Timaeus culminates in a vision of the world god.[3] What god are we talking about, exactly? Plato describes the universe that is the product of the Demiurge's work at Tim. 34a4, as 'a visible god.' Like Lovelock's Gaia, this deity is a corporeal entity whose life, intelligence, structure, and power permeate the whole universe of living things. Proclus describes the Demiurge's activity in building the world in terms of ten gifts bestowed on this world god, six of which involve the world's body (IT II.5.17-31):

1.  The cosmos is perceptible. 31b

2.  The four elements are bound to each other through proportion. 31c

3.  The cosmos is a whole made of wholes. 32c

4.  The cosmos has a spherical shape. 33b

5.  The cosmos is self-sufficient. 33c

6.  The cosmos moves with circular motion. 34a

The question of the nature and number of the world's elements as well as the proportion that binds them together occupies Proclus in the first part of the volume that Baltzly translates. In the second part, Proclus considers the question of how the world's having a body at all is compatible with the fact that Plato describes the universe as a deity.

By far the most difficult issue with which Proclus engages in Book III involves a controversy with Aristotle concerning the number of elements, and specifically, over the nature of celestial fire. The lemma from Plato's text that sparks the discussion is as follows: "that which comes to be must be corporeal and so visible and tangible. But nothing could come to be visible without fire" (31b). At III.9.7 Proclus anticipates an Aristotelian objection, "perhaps the marvelous Aristotle will contest our account by positing that not all visible things are so through participation in fire, for the chorus of stars and the mighty sun itself are not things composed of fire even though they are visible."

Here Proclus attempts to refute Aristotle's proof of the composition of the celestial bodies from the fifth element, aether, as it is presented in the De caelo I.2. The steps of this refutation involve a tour de force of Neoplatonic physics, mathematics, and acoustics. Rejecting the fifth element, as well as Aristotle's theory of its circular motion out of dogmatic Platonist allegiance (III.42.10-23; p. 90), Proclus must account for the circular motion of the heavenly bodies. Here he adopts Plotinus' un-Aristotelian theory of natural motion, according to which bodies move rectilinearly only when they are out of place;[4] conversely, fire when it is in its natural place is able to move in a circular motion.[5] However, Plotinus failed to offer an explanation as to why an element that should be at rest can move in a circle. Thus accepting this theory involves Proclus in developing a positive account of the elements, based on a survey of Plato's descriptions in the Timaeus, in which each element is defined in terms of three properties:





Easy mobility




Easy mobility




Easy mobility






The key here is that Fire, while its native place is 'above,' always enjoys the property of easy mobility, unlike earth, which has the native property of immobility. Hence, celestial Fire moves with a circular motion (the only motion available to it). Now for Proclus, Earth and Fire are 'opposite elements,' because each is a mirror image of the other in the terms of these fundamental properties; Proclus then fuses this elemental theory with a mathematical theory in light of Tim. 31b9-c4, where Plato discusses 'the bond' that brings these opposites, fire and earth, together:

Now whenever of three numbers, solids, or powers (dunameis), the middle term between any two of them is such that what the first term is to it, it is to the last, and conversely, what the last term is to the middle, it is to the first, then -- since the middle term turns out to be both first and last, and the last and the first likewise turn out to be middle terms, they will all of necessity turn out to have the same relationship to each other, and given this, all of them will be unified. (31b9-c4, lemma at III.10-18)

Therefore if the body of the universe had come to be as a plane, having no depth, a single middle term would have been sufficient to bind both it and the things with itself (sic). But in fact it has been assigned to be a three-dimensional solid and solid things are never conjoined by a single middle term but always by two middles. (32a7-b3, lemma at III.28.9-14)

In order to discuss this lemma, which brings out a unique feature of Baltzly's translation (viz., the extent to which Baltzly as a translator bears in mind what Proclus understands in the original text), we need to be somewhat familiar with elementary facts of Greek mathematics.

Consider the phrase at Tim. 31b9, hopotan gar arithmón trión eite ogkón eite dunameón … to meson, which Baltzly translates as, 'now whenever of three numbers, solids, or powers (dunameis), the middle term'. First, as Proclus explains, numbers in general can be represented as 'plane,' that is, consisting of two factors, each of which represents a 'side' of a rectangle (or square, if the 'sides' are even). Numbers can also be represented as 'solid,' that is, consisting of three factors, which in the words of Proclus, 'are multiplied to make a fourth,' and which are conceived as the three sides of a solid. And again, that solid can be a cube, if all of the sides are even.

For example, the number six is a rectangular number that contains sides of three and two, while the number four is a square number that contains sides of two and two, and the number eight is a cube number that contains sides of two and two and two. (Proclus discusses the details of plane versus solid numbers in his Commentary, III.30.16-33.10; pp. 77-8.) Now we return to the Platonic lemma. Baltzly points out that these words have been the subject of controversy for Plato's translators. Just how are we to take the genitives, ogkón and dunameón, and what does the word dunameón even mean? For example, Zeyl has "whenever of three numbers that are solids or squares the middle term".[6] That is, the words ogkos and dunamis taken in this sense refer precisely to the square numbers or solid numbers under discussion. By contrast, Baltzly's translation hinges on Proclus' interpretation of the passage. According to Baltzly, for Proclus, Plato here refers to numbers, solids, and generally any powers that might belong to the world, using dunamis in such a way as to be able later to extrapolate from the properties of geometric proportions present among solid numbers, to the proportions present in the cosmic elements (earth, air, fire and water). When modern translators (relying on Cornford) take the word dunamis to mean 'square number,' in contrast to the solid number, they make Plato introduce a thesis which, Baltzly shows, in fact vitiates the point that Plato later goes on to make, which is that solid numbers require two mean terms.[7]

Why all this talk of what Proclus calls in his Commentary, 'the mathematical facts' (p. 76)? Recall that Proclus has been discussing Tim. 31b-32c, where Plato shows that there are four elements and only four elements (i.e. no Aristotelian fifth element) that comprise the universe. Proclus attempts to analyze Plato's 'proof' that there must be four elements, by drawing on the analogy from mathematics that Plato makes. Thus when Plato says that 'solids are joined by two [middle terms],' Proclus must show the mathematical validity of this statement, a task that he accomplishes via a lengthy disquisition (III.28-36, almost eight pages of the Commentary) taking into account the previous commentaries of the Platonists Democritus and Proclus' own teacher, Syrianus. The reader of this review will have to be content with one simple example that Proclus uses, in which he illustrates the existence of two middle terms between solid numbers, actually cubes, eight and twenty-seven:

The one [i.e. eight] has a side of two, while the side of the other [i.e. twenty-seven] is three. One middle term comes to be from two × two × three or twelve, and through this composition is called a 'beam'. The other mean comes from three × three × two or eighteen and is called a 'brick'. (III.35.18-23; p. 82)

Proceeding further in the Commentary, Proclus now returns to the Aristotelian objector, considering how, if there is no fifth element, Plato is able to account for the difference that Neoplatonists recognized, following Aristotle and in keeping with the general tendency to harmonize the doctrines of Plato and Aristotle whenever possible, between the sublunar cosmos and what Proclus calls at III 43.3 (p. 90) the 'heavenly essence.' In this section of the Commentary, Proclus invokes various authorities, among whom we find the Chaldean Oracles, the Orphic theologians, a 'Pythagorean' table listing the elements found among the celestial bodies, and Plato himself. The upshot is that Proclus imports his theory of the various grades of reality, the well-known taxeis, or chains of Being, into the universe of Plato:

The elements exist in one way as unmixed objects of thought, but in another way as things that have been intermingled. The primary mixture of them which creates the heavens has all things in a fiery fashion and in it are the highest forms of all things. But the secondary mixture comprises the elements as they are found below the moon, in which all things exist in the manner of a middle term. (49.13-18; p. 99)

Again, Baltzly is able to bring out the nuances of Proclus' interpretation of Plato's text via his careful translation of the lemma. Here Baltzly translates Tim. 32c 6-8 (ek gar puros pantos hudatos te kai aeros kai gés) as follows:

The builder built it from all the [kinds of] fire, water, air and earth there are, and left no part or power of any of them out. (lemma at III.50.15-16; p. 100)

Proclus says that the words, 'all the fire' indicate that 'there are many [grades] of fire in the universe' (III.50.18; p. 100). If the previous translation showed a way that Proclus can be taken to improve our reading of the text and avoid a contradiction, this example, by Baltzly's own admission, seems 'forced' (n. 169). However unlikely it is that 'all of the fire' could mean 'the different kinds of fire,' Baltzly's ability to capture the far-fetched interpretation of Proclus adds an authenticity to his translation work. So far, I have summed up some of the issues that Proclus introduces over the course of fifty-six pages of the Greek commentary text (pp. 37-109 in Baltzly's translation), which cover Stephanus pages 31b-32c9. Neoplatonic science is slow paced, or so it would seem.

Still focusing on the last Platonic lemma, that the Demiurge left no part or power of any of the elements external to the cosmos,[8] Proclus discusses the third gift of the Demiurge, viz., that the cosmos is a whole of wholes, a provision that Proclus derives from what follows in Plato's text, Tim. 32c8-33a6. For Proclus, the epithets that Plato uses, 'complete,' 'one' and free from 'old age and disease,' or as Proclus has it, 'the uniqueness, sempiternity and completeness of the world,' are derived from prior causes. That is, the universe has been modeled on the Paradigm, the intelligible world or world of Forms that is perfect, uniform and eternal. But the intelligible world is itself a member of what Neoplatonists would call the realm of Being, whose terms are ordered as a typically Proclean triad, the One-Being, Eternity, and the Paradigm, that is, Being, Life, and Intellect, at a certain level of reality. For Proclus, the universe will always manifest the higher causes at a lower degree of unity and being; the origin of the three Platonic epithets resides in this remote triad. Yet, much of this section is also devoted to showing how these qualities are inter-entailing, or as Proclus says 'convertible with respect to their subject,' the universe (II.59). In other words, if the cosmos uses up all of the four elements, then there is nothing with which to make another world outside of the universe. Hence completeness entails uniqueness. Likewise, if there is no other world outside of our world, then our world will not be subject to the external influences likely to result in the deterioration of the world's body, and hence its everlastingness.

At III.68, Proclus moves on to another Platonic lemma concerning the spherical shape of the universe, the fourth gift of the demiurge (Tim. 33b1-8). The Commentary here reveals a ranking of the arguments that purport to prove the spherical shape of the universe, from what Proclus calls Platonic apodeixis, to what he calls the philosophical arguments of Iamblichus, and finally, to the physical arguments of Aristotle. As Baltzly points out in his Introduction, the order of the arguments presented here, in which the Aristotelian or physical and mathematical arguments follow and are thus conceived as weaker than Platonic 'demonstration,' will serve as a reminder of the Neoplatonist exegetical project as a whole, which involves a reconciliation not just of 'theological' traditions (Orphic, Pythagorean, and Chaldean) but also of Plato and Aristotle, and perhaps even a subordination of Aristotelian science to Platonic intuition.

The 'real' demonstration at III.69-70 (pp. 125-27) is a somewhat confusing congeries of what can only be called arguments by analogy: Proclus' argument from the One shows that, since the One contains all things, so the sphere is the shape in which all of the regular solids can be inscribed. Again, in arguments two and three, the shape of the universe is said to be 'fitting,' or else, similar to the intelligible cosmos which 'converges into itself,' in a way that could be likened to the shape of a sphere. On pages III.73-5 Proclus traverses five arguments from the De caelo in short compass, as follows:

1.  The circular motion of the universe entails movement in a sphere.

2.  The distribution of water around the earth and flow of water toward the center show that the universe is spherical.

3.  The primacy of the universe's body demands the sphere as its primary shape.

4.  The movement of the periphery of the cosmos is the swiftest motion, which is the least motion, and hence, the measure of heavenly motion.

5.  The aether is composed of similar parts, and the shape of that which is composed of similar parts is itself similar, while the sphere is the most similar shape among solids. Therefore the aether is spherical in shape.

After this discussion of the sphericity of the universe, Proclus considers whether the universe has sense perception. This consideration follows from Plato's denial that the world has 'eyes, for nothing visible remained external to it; nor ears, for there was nothing to hear' (33c1-3). As the universe is a living thing, the universe must be sensitive; consequently, it will have perception (aesthesis) of the kind that imitates intellect. Again, the universe includes everything that is sensible, and it is itself the first sensible thing (III.91.17), and so the universe has a 'single sense conjoining it to such a sensible object.' For cosmic perception, which imitates intellect, the object of perception is included in perception, given that in intellectual awareness, the subject and object are one. Proclus says that the cosmos as a whole is 'both a thing that is seen and an eye,' and 'both vision and what is visible' (III.84.10; p. 144). Although the universe does not have organs for touch, it 'includes powers analogous to hands, digestive organs and breath.' Its rule over all things is the equivalent of hands, its progressively more perfect orders are analogous to digestive organs; its living systems are the equivalent of respiration. Particularly in this section of the Commentary, we see the Gaia hypothesis emerging.

Proclus concludes this consideration of the world's body with a quote that reminds the reader of the theological nature of the discourse: "All this then being the plan devised by the god who exists eternally for the god who will at some time be …" (Tim. 34a3). The world's body is characterized by its circular motion in imitation of intellect, while (II.93.18) perhaps a little surprisingly its self-sufficiency, intellective motion and revolution in the same place correspond to "the god who ingests all his offspring."[9] Again, these traits reveal the difficult problem with which Proclus grapples in this portion of the Commentary. The universe is a god and yet, it would seem that the world's body is a corporeal entity. As such, this entity exists 'in time'; indeed it is coeval with all the time that there is, although it always exists at a particular time. For Proclus, the bond of the elements, brought about through proportion, produces the completeness of the universe, in the sense that there can be no body external to it. When this cosmos comes to be, its body imitates the higher cause that establishes its divinity through the six gifts of the Demiurge. Thus at every moment, or throughout time as a whole, the world is complete. As Proclus tells us, the universe "has its limitless capacity for being from an external source, and since the capacity that it has at any point is thus limited, then by virtue of this fact it always-is by always-receiving (III.100.19-22; p. 163). It is owing to the special status of the universe as a god that it nevertheless comes to be that Proclus must practice the encyclopedic method he employs in book three of the Commentary. The Timaeus for Proclus is grounded in intellectual intuitions or non-discursive truths, but is expressed as a scientific discourse. This fact explains not only why Proclus finds it necessary to list Aristotelian arguments side by side with references to Orphic theology, but why ultimately the highest forms of explanation consist in the Platonic/Pythagorean study of true causes -- efficient, final, and exemplary.

Baltzly, and indeed the entire In Timaeum project as it has been published to date, have presented a model that every translator of Neoplatonic texts should aspire to follow. The result of this painstakingly translated and annotated Commentary is a distinct improvement on the already fine work of Festugière, which indeed is its launching point. But by devoting one volume to the topic of the world's body, Baltzly has succeeded in showing that Proclus' exegesis of the Timaeus starts as theology and so embraces nothing short of a pantheism that ultimately must guide his arguments and indeed his science as a whole. In this way, by elucidating what might be thought of as the eccentricity of Proclus' Commentary, Baltzly has renewed the dialogue between ancient and modern earth science. Viva Gaia!


Baltzly, D. 2002. "What goes up: Proclus against Aristotle on the fifth element," Australian Journal of Philosophy, 80, 261-87.

Tarrant, H. 2007. Introduction to Book I in Proclus: Commentary on Plato's Timaeus. Vol. I, H. Tarrant, translator. Cambridge.

[1] The larger project, a collective undertaking of Baltzly, Harold Tarrant, David Runia, and Michael Share, aims at offering the first English translation of this work since Thomas Taylor's 1820 effort. It closes the ever-narrowing gap in the works of this late antique philosopher now available in English.

[2] Tarrant 2007, 46 attributes the importance of skopos and curriculum in the Platonic commentary tradition to the influence of Iamblichus.

[3] Tarrant 2007, 47, citing Olympiodorus' Prolegomena to the Study of Plato's Philosophy and Proclus' own remarks in Book I. However, Baltzly (Introduction, p. 1) cites I.1.17-20, and finds that physiologia, or the study of Nature, is the target of the dialogue. Yet he also suggests that Proclus must inevitably trace natural explanation back to Demiurge, the Paradigm, and the Form of the Good.

[4] Cf. III.12.7: "it is simply a mistake to say that when fire moves in a straight line it is moved in accordance with nature."

[5] Baltzly Introduction, p. 7 and n. 50, p. 53. He discusses these issues at greater length in Baltzly 2002.

[6] Zeyl (in Plato: Complete Works. Cooper and Hutchinson, eds.) thus follows in what Baltzly refers to as the Cornford tradition.

[7] I do not wish to nitpick the outstanding work of Baltzly, but since he has made rather a lot of this lemma, I wonder why he chooses to translate the word dunameón by 'powers' at 20.10 and then translates the same phrase, arithmous, ogkous and dunameis, (22.17; p. 67) as, 'numbers, volumes, and musical values?' Baltzly's argument, that Proclus would see Plato's need to rely on a broad conception of power at this point in the text in order to introduce the idea of elements as proportionally related solids, does not overcome the argument from proximity of the meaning of dunamis as musical value.

[8] Baltzly points out that Proclus actually cites the Platonic lemma using the word apoleipón at 50, when he is trying to prove that Plato assumes the truth of Proclus' own doctrine of graded elements, and hupoleipón at 56, where Proclus goes on to show that the Demiurge uses all of the available elements within one unique universe.

[9] Again, Proclus mixes Aristotle with Orphic theology, appealing to the passage in the Orphic cosmology "when the Theologians talk about one god engulfing another."