Common Law Theory

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Douglas E. Edlin (ed.), Common Law Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 247pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521846424.

Reviewed by W.J. Waluchow, McMaster University


The common law is an intriguing phenomenon. It's also extremely fertile ground for testing philosophical theories concerning the nature of law, legal reasoning, and legal obligation, as well as exploring the myriad other questions which occupy legal philosophers. Does the common law consist of a body of rules validated by something like H.L.A. Hart's rule of recognition?[1] If so, what are the appropriate criteria of validity? And where are the rules they supposedly validate to be found? The stock answer is that the common law is established in the legal rules judges use to decide cases. Hence the view that the common law is "case law." But if common law is case law, precisely where in legal cases are common law rules to be found? Among the most theoretically troubling features of such rules -- assuming that they do indeed exist -- is that they are not canonically formulated in the manner of statutory rules. Judges seldom formulate anything remotely like what we normally think of as a rule when they decide cases. Rather, they explain and defend their decisions by citing reasons, doctrines, precedents, and so on. Often they cite what appear to be moral, political and social considerations. But these are not the kinds of things we normally think of as legal rules; rather they seem to be factors one could draw on to support the adoption, application, alteration or rejection of such rules. And so our question remains: where precisely do we locate common law rules? And then there is this peculiar feature of common law rules: they are quite often capable of revision in the very act of application by a judge, a respect in which they seem quite unlike, say, statutory rules which judges are not free to change. How can rules, revisable at point of application, be intelligently thought of as legally "binding" on a decision-maker? Indeed, can they sensibly be said to be rules at all? One final question: from whom or what do common law rules obtain their authoritative status? According to some traditional theories, common law rules are meant to reflect the fundamental customs or traditions of the community and derive their authority from this source. According to other theories, however, they are the inventions of judges, whose authority to create law has always been a matter of considerable theoretical and political controversy. If we struggle to answer such questions, then we might be tempted to agree with Ronald Dworkin that it is a serious philosophical mistake to think of the common law -- indeed, if Dworkin if right, law in general -- as a set of valid rules, the animating charge of Dworkin's early critique of Hart's "model of rules."[2]

These and other perplexing questions of legal philosophy are addressed by the various contributors to this fascinating volume of original essays. The book is divided thematically into three sections. The first deals with the existence and nature of common law rules. Emily Sherwin and Larry Alexander consider a range of theories about the role of judicial precedent in establishing common law rules -- a range which mirrors to a very large extent the family of theories developed by rule and act utilitarians in their disputes with one another -- and conclude that precedents are best thought to establish, explicitly or implicitly, rules which later judges are bound to observe unless a new case reveals the rule to be "obviously and seriously unjustified." (50) Common law rules, then, are indeed "binding" but only insofar as there is a strong, but rebuttable presumption in their favour. John Gardiner for his part is concerned to square the existence and nature of the common law with his theoretical commitment to legal positivism. As Gardiner notes, the common law is quite unlike statutory law which is canonically formulated and intentionally 'posited' by an authoritative body like a parliament or congress. That is, it is not "made by being expressed." (75) On the contrary, common law is made by being relied upon by judges. "The rule in the case has to be worked out by examining the judge's argument, to see what rule he implicitly, and maybe accidentally, relied upon." (75). It is therefore, Gardiner concludes, indeed brought into existence by someone (in this case the judge) who relies on it, and is therefore consistent with the positivist's (apparent) claim that "no legal norms come into existence without being brought into existence by someone." (75) One wonders, however, whether Gardiner may have underplayed the difficulty of trying to explain how implicit, accidentally generated rules can be extracted from cases in a manner consistent with legal positivism. Can accidentally relying on a rule be equated with positing or creating it?

Section two is concerned with the modes of reasoning employed by judges as they go about deciding cases under common law. Here a host of issues come to the fore including: the justification of requiring judges to follow precedents even in cases where a different result would be preferable, whether and in what ways judges should rely on reasoning by analogy in developing common law rules to fit new cases, and whether and in what ways such reasoning differs from more straight forward deductive reasoning. Melvin Eisenberg usefully summarizes his now familiar theory of the common law. Courts serve a crucial social role by generating common law norms as a more or less accidental by-product of resolving legal disagreements among citizens. Eisenberg calls these norms "doctrinal propositions" and distinguishes them from "social propositions" which are, in his view, the moral, political, and empirical commitments and understandings of a society which lie behind its doctrinal propositions. Social propositions are used to justify doctrinal propositions and to support, when appropriate, changes to and departures from doctrinal propositions. In fact, without considering underlying social propositions, we could not even begin to understand doctrinal ones, a view famously defended (though in different terms) by Lon Fuller in his debate with H.L.A. Hart.[3] Gerald Postema tries to develop a theory of common law analogical thinking which avoids the extremes of "particularism" and "rule-rationalism." Particularism claims that each case stands on its own distinctive reasons, and therefore reduces to a kind of rule-skepticism. There are, in short, no common law rules. Rule-rationalism, on the other hand, claims that analogies must be based on antecedently determined relevant similarities between cases, and that these can, in turn, be determined only on the basis of pre-existing rules. There must, in short, already be common law rules to support analogical thinking. But neither theory captures how the common law actually works. "In view of the dynamic and open nature of the process of analogical reasoning, no formulation of a rule can hope to achieve anything more than a useful approximation, for some stretch of time, of the practical significance of the cases in view." (121) "To grasp a judicial decision as an example is to locate it in an inferential network of mutually supporting judgments." (133) All this should give positivists pause before assuming that all law can be reduced to a set of rules validated by something like Hart's rule of recognition -- a theme picked up on by David Dyzenhaus and Michael Taggart. Their contribution splits into two parts. First, we find an historical exploration of the judicial practice of citing reasons for decisions (from which common law rules are supposedly derived). This is a practice which has been in existence for some 800 years, but which has not, according to the authors, been supported by a legal obligation on the part of judges. "It may be that an explicit legal duty to give reasons was considered unnecessary because the judges did so by convention." (137) But the fact remains that "judges did not consider themselves under a duty to give reasons until very recently." (151) All this leads to the second, and in many ways more intriguing, section of the paper. According to Dyzenhaus and Taggart, the contemporary practice of providing reasons for judicial decisions is based on the belief that the authority of those decisions depends on the persuasiveness of the reasons underlying -- i.e. justifying -- those decisions. And if this is so, then the so-called positivist conception of the authority of law -- one which supposedly sees the authority of law as a separate issue from its justification -- must be jettisoned. Furthermore, honest positivists will be led, for these reasons, to see the complete folly of their view and the good sense to be found in either a natural law or Dworkinian approach to understanding law, an approach according to which law's existence and authority cannot be separated from its merits. Whether this conclusion follows depends, to a very large extent, on the success of positivists in devising satisfactory theoretical accounts of legal authority and of Hart's criteria of legal validity. Earlier, I questioned whether John Gardner has given sufficient weight to the difficulty of extracting valid rules from judicial decisions (presumably in a way which separates the validity and authority of those rules from their merits). One might in turn question whether Dyzenhaus and Taggart have underestimated the theoretical resources open to positivists such as Gardner, and whether their account of the positivists' conception of authority does justice to the variety and sophistication of the various versions of that conception.[4]

Can the (apparent) authority of common law courts to create and develop law be reconciled with democracy? Judges tend not to be elected and are therefore not democratically accountable in familiar ways. So the question naturally arises: Should judges be creating law in a well-functioning democracy? Perhaps only if, as one standard theory has it, common law judges are in the business of creating and developing law which reflects long-standing customs and traditions of the community. And so their decisions do have a democratic pedigree, indirect though it might be. But even here there are problems, given how difficult and contentious a matter it is to determine precisely what the customs and traditions of a community really amount to and require in concrete cases. Will an honest appraisal of common law decision-making lead us to conclude that the judges, who must "interpret" our customs and traditions before they can create rules reflective of them, are in reality creating law all along, and doing so according to their own moral and political lights? Here's another question: Does the common law contain within itself the resources to provide constitutional constraints on the various powers of government? In other words, does the common law provide the basis for an "unwritten constitution" which constrains government power, say the power of a parliament or president bent on suspending habeas corpus in a time of emergency? If the answer is 'yes' and if common law rules are made by judges, then how can this authority to restrict government power possibly be squared with democratic ideals? And, if, as is usually assumed, common law is of lesser authority than statutory law, how do we make sense of the idea that the common law provides a basis for judicially enforced restrictions on the statutory powers of a congress or parliament?

These are some of the questions addressed by the authors whose contributions round out Edlin's excellent volume. James Stoner provides an historical synopsis of the common law heritage of the American constitution, suggesting that "constitutional interpretation must keep account of the common law context in which the [American] Constitution was written and adopted to be true to the original understanding of the regime." That original understanding, Stoner argues, was rooted in traditional natural law theory. Hence, to understand both the common law and the American Constitution, one must understand the deliverances of natural law. Trevor Allan likewise finds the roots of constitutional law in the common law.

In anglophone legal systems , the common law provides a constitutional foundation for legitimate government … It aspires to nurture and sustain a coherent constitutional morality, reflecting widely shared commitments to a fundamental ideal of equal justice. (185)

Viewed as a process of governance, the common law provides a constantly evolving blend of traditional wisdom and fresh moral insight. The various formal sources of law -- precedent, legislation, and constitution -- establish the paradigm cases that any eligible legal interpretation must respect; but the true meaning of any particular decision or statute or constitutional provision must be determined in the light of everything else. (203)

Those familiar with contemporary debates in general legal theory will recognize the echoes of Ronald Dworkin's interpretive theory of law in this account. And they will also be well aware of its highly contentious nature, as well as the variety of positivist theories which have been developed to counter Dworkin's (and hence Allan's) claims. One such positivist is Jeffrey Goldsworthy, who seeks to expose what he calls "the myth of the common law constitution." Goldsworthy begins with history.

[T]here is no evidence of significant, if any, support for common law constitutionalism before the seventeenth century … The idea that the authority of the judges' superiors -- the king who appointed and could dismiss them, and the High Court of Parliament that could overturn their decisions -- was the product of their decisions, or of their "erudition," would have been dismissed out of hand as an absurdity. (228)

Furthermore, in the seventeenth century, only a few judges accepted the theory, while the seventeenth century brought with it clear recognition that every sovereign state must include a sovereign legislator "that by definition stands above the law." (229) Next, Goldsworthy turns to philosophical analysis where he invokes Hart's legal positivism to argue that the so-called "unwritten constitution," which authors like Allan find in a "common law" whose authority transcends the decisions of judges, legislators and constitutional authors, is actually established "by a consensus among the senior officials of all branches of government." (235) As such, the norms of the "unwritten constitution" are much closer to what Hart called "rules of recognition" than to anything remotely like common law principles supposedly rooted in natural law or "a fundamental ideal of equal justice."

As should be plain from the above reflections, Edlin has put together an exciting volume touching on a broad range of philosophical questions surrounding the nature of law and legal reasoning, and the foundations of political authority and sovereignty. It will be of great interest to anyone who is at all interested in such questions.

[1] See H.L.A. Hart, The Concept of Law (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1961).

[2] See Dworkin, Taking Rights Seriously (2nd ed.) (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1978).

[3] H.L.A. Hart, "Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals," Harvard Law Review (1958), 59.
Lon Fuller, "Positivism and Fidelity to Law -- A Reply to Professor Hart," 71 Harvard Law Review (1958), 630.

[4] See, e.g., Joseph Raz, The Authority of Law (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979); Leslie Green, The Authority of the State (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988).