Common Morality: Deciding What to Do

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Bernard Gert, Common Morality: Deciding What to Do, Oxford University Press, 2004, 208pp, $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195173716.

Reviewed by Philip Stratton-Lake, University of Reading


In this book Bernard Gert aims to describe and justify common morality. Common morality, as he understands it, is the moral system that most thoughtful people implicitly use in arriving at moral judgements. According to Gert this system is based on five basic harms -- death, pain, disability, loss of freedom, loss of pleasure. From these five harms we get ten moral rules that capture the core of common morality: 1. Do not kill 2. Do not cause pain, 3. Do not disable, 4. Do not deprive of freedom, 5. Do not deprive of pleasure, 6. Do not deceive, 7. Keep your promises, 8. Do not cheat, 9. Obey the law, and 10. Do your duty. The first five rules prohibit inflicting the five basic harms directly, whereas the second five prohibit actions that cause those same harms indirectly. So the first five rules are basic, and the second five derivative (although Gert does not describe them in this way).

These rules specify what morality requires of us, which for Gert means that violations make one vulnerable to punishment. But common morality also includes certain ideals. These ideals encourage, but do not require, us to act so as to prevent others from suffering the basic harms. Failure to act in accordance with these ideals does not involve liability to punishment.

Gert denies that his ten rules generate a single right answer for every set of circumstances. His view is that there is no single right answer in difficult cases, so fully informed rational agents may disagree about what one should do. Disagreement in difficult cases need not be the result of some intellectual or moral defect.

Gert does not conceive of his ten moral rules as absolute in the sense that one always does wrong whenever one violates any one of them. His view is that a violation is not wrong if it has an adequate justification. Gert offers a two-step procedure for justifying violations. First, one must find out all of the morally relevant facts and with these provide a complete description of the morally relevant features of the action. (This involves answering ten questions.) Second, one must estimate the consequences of everyone knowing that that kind of violation is allowed and of everyone knowing that this kind of violation is not allowed, and rank the harmful and beneficial consequences of the two estimates. If general knowledge that such violations are allowed leads to a better outcome than a general knowledge that they are not allowed, then the violation is justified.

Having laid out what he regards as the moral system implicit in common morality, Gert turns to its justification. This justification involves showing that every rational agent would, under certain conditions, endorse adopting a moral system that required everyone to act morally to other moral agents. The first of these conditions is that rational agents evaluate adoption of the moral system using only rationally required beliefs. Rationally required beliefs are those beliefs that are held by all rational agents. Gert calls this 'the blindfold of justice'. This blindfold excludes religious, nationalistic or scientific beliefs from rational agents' assessment of morality. The second condition is that they want agreement with all moral agents. Gert argues that, given these two constraints, rational persons must endorse morality, and that this is 'the strongest justification of morality that it is possible to provide' (85).

Although Gert thinks that all rational persons must endorse a general acceptance of morality and so maintains that it is never irrational to act morally, he does not think that all immoral actions are irrational (86). An objectively irrational act is one that (a) will cause or is likely to cause the agent to suffer one of the basic harms, and (b) there is no objectively adequate reason for the action. Personally irrational actions are those that the agent believes will harm herself, absent a belief that there is an adequate reason to do it. A rational action is one that is not irrational (97). Reasons of the sort that can make an otherwise irrational action rational are provided either by facts about the avoidance of harms or about the gaining of benefits with regard to anyone. Gert claims that only facts about harms and benefits provide reasons for action (103).

All reasons, Gert claims, have justifying force, and their justifying force is determined solely by the amount of harm avoided or by the amount of benefit gained. A reason with justifying force can make an otherwise irrational action rational, but it is not irrational not to act on it. The only reasons it is irrational to ignore are those provided by facts about harms or benefits to the agent (107). Such reasons have requiring force as well as justifying force. The fact that my act would harm someone gives me a reason not to do it. But since this reason has only justifying force, I do not act irrationally if I go ahead and do this act. But if my act would harm me in some way it would (absent adequate reasons to do it) be irrational for me to do this act. This is because the fact that my act would harm me has requiring force. The result of all of this is that in a conflict between morality and self-interest it cannot be rationally required to act morally.

Gert's theory is concise, subtle, and generally very plausible. It also manages successfully to incorporate elements from Kant, Mill, social contract theories and natural law theory. Furthermore, it is informed by a laudable desire to accommodate the moral facts rather than force them into some preconceived theoretical mould.

Gert claims that "none of the standard moral theories provide anything close to an adequate description of common morality" (7). Given this claim, I was surprised that he never mentions W. D. Ross; for Ross is generally regarded as having articulated a moral theory that most accurately reflects common-sense morality. So I would have been interested to know what Gert thinks Ross gets wrong and how Gert's own account is better.

Gert's theory may be thought to be closer to common sense in the respect that he regards beneficence as a moral ideal whereas Ross regards it as a moral requirement. Gert's view fits better with the intuition that often beneficence is supererogatory. But it is not clear that Gert has a clear advantage over Ross in this respect, for we also have a strong intuition that beneficence is often morally required. By failing to help someone when one could do so at little or no cost to oneself, one not only fails to live up to a moral ideal, but also fails to do what morality requires of one. This intuition favours Ross's view over Gert's. Furthermore, Ross would not claim that non-beneficence should make one liable to punishment. So if ideals are distinguished from moral requirements by the fact that non-compliance does not make one liable to punishment, then Ross's principle of beneficence may be regarded as an ideal rather than as a requirement. As far as beneficence goes, then, neither view has a clear-cut advantage over the other.

Another way in which Gert's theory may seem closer to common sense than Ross's is that there is no duty to oneself in Gert's system. For Gert to harm oneself for no good reason is irrational, but not immoral. In this respect I think Gert's theory is closer to common sense than Ross's.

There is, however, an important sense in which Ross's theory has the advantage, a respect that is relevant to the question of justification. Ross tries to capture common morality with his system of prima facie duties, whereas Gert does so with a system of categorical imperatives. For those who accept Kant's claims that moral duties are categorical imperatives, this difference may seem quite insignificant. But despite their apparent similarity, there are important differences between Ross's prima facie duties and Gert's imperatives. Ross is clear that his prima facie duties are not really duties at all. Prima facie duties do not tell us what our duty is, but tell us the reason why we ought to do certain acts. As I understand them, Ross's principles state that certain considerations (considerations of fidelity, gratitude, reparation, etc) provide moral reasons for acting in the appropriate way. Gert's principles, on the other hand, take the form of commands -- 'do this', 'don't do that'.

One very important difference between these two sets of principles relates to the need to justify common morality. If I am told to do something, it always makes sense to ask for a reason to do this, even if I accept that I should do what I have been commanded to do. So if there is a rule I accept that commands me not to harm others, then I may quite legitimately ask why I should not harm others. If, however, I am told that a certain consideration gives me a reason to act, and I accept that it does, then it makes no sense to ask for a reason to do this act. We need no reason to do what we accept we have reason to do, and if we did, no such reason could be given.

So if I am right to understand the notion of a prima facie duty in terms of a moral reason, then Ross's conception of common morality as a system of prima facie duties makes the justification of morality redundant. This is not because we need no justification to act in accordance with Ross's principles, but because the justification is given by the content of those principles. There remains a question of why moral reasons have the force they do --that is, why such reasons tend to win out in a conflict with self-interest. But this question is not asking for a justification of morality, but presupposes that we already have a justification for acting morally.

What I have said might miss the point of what Gert is trying to do in the second half of his book. What he is keen to show is that it is never irrational to act morally. It might be that to justify morality is, for Gert, precisely to show that moral action is never irrational.

We saw above that for Gert one acts irrationally (in the objective sense) if one knowingly harms oneself for no good reason. On this I think he is right, but I think that one can act irrationally in other ways also. It seems to me that people act irrationally whenever they act contrary to how they think they ought to act, irrespective of whether they harm themselves, or believe they will harm themselves, in doing so. Their actions are irrational because they fail to act as they believe they should.

If this is right, then sometimes it will be irrational to fail to act morally, and at other times it will be irrational to act morally. Immoral actions will be irrational when one does them believing that one ought to act as morality requires. Similarly, moral actions will be irrational when the agent believes that she ought to act immorally. If this is right, morality is not justified in Gert's sense. It is not justified because moral action is sometimes irrational.

I am not so worried by this consequence, as I am inclined to think that the question of justification has a much looser connection with issues of rationality than Gert takes it to have. To me the central question is not whether it is rational to act morally, but whether we have good reasons to act as morality requires, and how strong those reasons are.

There are many ways in which Gert's description of common morality is illuminating, and his justification of common morality is challenging. I admire the clarity and rigour of this book. I also welcome Gert's dismissal of artificially constructed moral theories that try to shape common morality rather than be shaped by it. This is a stimulating and intelligent book that anyone interested in these issues should read.