Common Sense in the Scottish Enlightenment

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Charles Bradford Bow (ed.), Common Sense in the Scottish Enlightenment, Oxford University Press, 2018, 226pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198783909.

Reviewed by Rebecca Copenhaver, Lewis and Clarke College


This volume, edited by Charles Bradford Bow, is an indispensable contribution to the philosophy, history of philosophy, and history of 18th Century Scotland. The two terms in its title -- common sense, and the Scottish Enlightenment -- are contested matters in current scholarship. It is a relief to learn from this collection that our current controversies over these matters are not new, nor are they the result of 19th century accounts guided by stadial, progressive, classificatory methods in history and philosophy, though surely these histories have played a role in the formation and persistence of the story of a Scottish School of Common Sense. Rather, disagreements about what common sense is, its role in the human mind and the science of mind, as well as disagreements about the place and purpose of philosophy in the practical lives of people and nations, arise in the sources themselves: from the works of those who came to be seen as exemplars of the Scottish School, as well as the works of their critics and immediate successors. And, as this volume reveals, the tensions we find when considering the Scottish School of Common Sense and its immediate reception are rooted in profound anxieties concerning religion, education, and national identity.

In the late 18th century and early 19th a story began to form. In that story, philosophy in Scotland was distinctive -- distinctive enough to be called a school -- and the feature that made it distinctive was an interest in common sense. A trio of Scottish philosophers were the main characters in the story: Thomas Reid (1710-1796), James Oswald (1703-1793), and James Beattie (1735-1803). Historians and philosophers have often located Joseph Priestley (1733-1804) as the source of the story, whose 1774 An examination of Dr. Reid's Inquiry . . . criticized the Scottish school and defended the Lockean system. In Chapter 8, Paul B. Wood argues that Joseph Berington (1743-1827), rather than Priestley, is the source of the story, which Wood describes as "one of the abiding myths in the history of philosophy" (p.186). True, Wood argues, Reid was and is recognized as an exemplar of the school, but Beattie, Oswald, and other figures associated with the school received little reception past their own time and place. Wood examines the creation and lifespan of the myth of the Scotch School of common sense using detailed and understudied textual and historical resources. He reveals that while the conversations among those identified with the school and their critics were conducted in philosophical terms, these conversations were animated by intense disagreements among Christians, dissenters, and unbelievers. We cannot hope to understand this period absent the kind of social, religious, cultural, institutional, and political context that Wood expertly provides.

As Giovanni Gellera points out in Chapter 1, the story of the Scottish school of common sense has an immediate and obvious flaw. If a commitment to common sense forms the basis of the 18th century Scottish school, then David Hume cannot have been a part of it. Yet Hume is the most famous Scottish philosopher of the 18th century and he is widely recognized as one of the greatest philosophers in the Western tradition. Another flaw in the story of the 18th century school is inevitable when we carve philosophy's history into stages and schools: interest in and appeal to common sense "developed earlier and existed longer," in Scotland, as Gellera shows. But perhaps the most glaring flaw in the story is the implication that there was or is any common sense of the term 'common sense.' A reading of this book reveals a variety of disparate uses of the term. These uses reflect both interpretive differences and differences in the original philosophical sources themselves. Here are some of the many ways the notion of common sense is and was understood, based on a reading of this book:

-- universal, instinctive beliefs

-- self-evident beliefs

-- beliefs explained by laws of human psychology

-- laws of human psychology

-- what sense perception presents to subjects under normal conditions

-- sense perception as, or immediately causing, or having as a part, justified beliefs

-- sense perception as a reliable source of knowledge

-- general facts about perceptual belief

-- a general faculty for discerning evidence

In addition to arguing that a concern for common sense extends beyond the spatial and temporal borders imposed by the traditional story, Gellera argues that what unites these thinkers is a picture of sensory perception as verdictive -- as being identical with, causing, or having as a part -- beliefs about the properties and objects presented in perception. Gellera's case for 'persuasive perception', as Patrick Hardie put it, is relevant to current debates about how to interpret Reid's theory of perception. But the very existence of these debates shows that we cannot assume a univocal notion of common sense either among the thinkers in question or among ourselves.

While there is little consensus -- then or now -- about common sense, there is agreement about where to look if we want to understand it: the nature and workings of the human mind. Reid and his contemporaries took the phenomenon of common sense to be the result of what the human mind is like and how it operates. Common sense is the result of our constitution. In Chapter 3, Claire Etchegaray studies Reid's unpublished manuscript "Of constitution." Reid's science of the human mind seeks regularities in the operations of mind, revealed by observation and reflection. The goal is to use induction to formulate general laws of (what we would now call) human psychology. These laws are then used to explain particular mental phenomena. Etchegaray examines whether "Of constitution" can help us understand the relationship between Reid's science and his references to God. Etchegaray argues that Reid's science is a kind of "experimental theism" because the operations of our constitution that are both the subject of, and observational basis for, that science are themselves the results of God's will. The operations of the human mind are reliable (but fallible) and reference to God explains this otherwise brute fact. The human mind is an active substance, and its activity is both regular and reliable, but its regularity and reliability are not the result of human agency. They are effects of the divine agent. Etchegaray's study of this neglected manuscript reveals new interpretive options: we need not interpret Reid's references to God as entailing the view that the mind is "hid in impenetrable darkness," but neither need we interpret his commitment to the new science as cleaving theological matters from matters of natural philosophy.

In "On the Ancestry of Reid's Inquiry," Giovanni B. Grandi examines the development of Reid's views about the relationship between (a) the sensations we have when perceiving colors, and (b) the visible shape and extension we perceive when seeing objects. Grandi shows that in the early manuscripts, Reid regarded the sensations we enjoy when perceiving colors as themselves spatially arranged and thus at least minimally extended (in at least a two-dimensional field). This position allows sensations to resemble the visible shapes we perceive at least in respect of being spatial. In his published work, however, Reid is committed to a kind of heterogeneity thesis: sensations and perceptions are different in kind; perceptions share no features with sensations by which one resembles or copies the other. This mature position led Reid to deny that sensations possess even minimal spatiality. Grandi illuminates the reception of Reid's views by considering how his critic John Fearn (1768-1837), and his interpreters, Dugald Stewart (1753-1828) and William Hamilton (1788-1856) understood Reid's distinction between sensation and perception. Grandi's insights will interest those working on Reid's theory of perception, particularly his famous 'geometry of visibles,' as well as anyone working on 17th and 18th century theories of vision more generally.

In "Was Reid a Moral Realist?" Gordon Graham argues that while Reid unequivocally opposes sentimentalism, this does not entail that he is thereby committed to a realist metaphysics about moral properties. Reid holds that feeling plays a role in moral judgment but denies that moral judgments are identical with feelings. According to Graham, Reid holds that "morality is first and foremost a matter of rational judgment" and that while Reid speaks of a moral sense, we should not understand him to mean that moral properties are literally parts of the contents of sensory-perceptual experience or that conscience is a "sixth sense" (pp.43, 47, 49). Not being a literal sense, the existence of a moral sense (or conscience) does not entail the existence of sensed moral properties. Rather, sense perception is one important source of evidence by which we make judgments of right and wrong. To exercise the moral sense is to make such judgments rather than to experience moral properties. Graham's interpretation of Reid contributes to current debates over whether Reid is a moral realist and whether to read Reid as an early proponent of the view that moral properties are represented in the contents of perception.

In each of their contributions, Esther Engels Kroeker and James A. Harris confront the puzzle of how to fit David Hume into the story of the Scottish school of common sense. Kroeker asks whether Reid intends his moral psychology to be more than an alternative to Hume's: whether he intended it also as a response to Hume's skepticism about natural and revealed religion. The Aberdeen Philosophical Society, of which Reid was a member, was founded in part as a reaction to Hume's work, which was seen by them, as Kroeker puts it, "as a defense of necessitarianism, materialism, [and] moral scepticism . . . which led to a kind of atheisim" (p.108).[1] Reid's moral psychology, like Hume's, is an attempt to use the experimental method to understand morality as a natural phenomenon, and both Reid and Hume regarded morality as separate from religion. They depart from one another, according to Kroeker, over the implications of understanding morality as grounded in human nature. For Hume, the fact that moral evaluations can be explained in purely psychological terms shows that they are not the product of reason but of sentiment, and as such relative to human nature. For Reid, the psychological mechanisms that explain moral evaluations are facts about subjects, but not thereby subjective. Kroeker responds to Graham's contribution by defending her reading of Reid as a moral realist: for Reid, moral evaluations are beliefs about moral facts that are independent of the evaluations themselves. According to Kreoker, Reid's moral psychology shows that a naturalist account of morality that recognizes the role of feelings in moral evaluation need not entail sentimentalism. In doing so, Reid offers more than an alternative account: he "answer[s] and reject[s] Hume's moral atheism" (p.124).

In "Hume and the Common Sense Philosophers," Harris demonstrates that Hume engaged with the work of both Reid and George Campbell (1719-1796) and took them both seriously. He disapproved of Beattie's aggressive rhetoric, but he was hardly alone in this attitude. And apart from Beattie, we have reason to think that the respect was mutual. If Hume inspired the creation of the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, it was out of concern and esteem. Nevertheless, as Kroeker emphasized, Hume's common sense critics were unified in understanding Hume as a skeptic, and in fearing the effects of that skepticism.

In 18th century Scotland, moral and natural philosophy were conducted and taught for practical ends: the intellectual, moral, cultural, and material improvement of lives, particularly the lives of those in Scotland. As Harris argues, it is this feature that distinguishes Hume from his fellow Scots: his science of human nature is intended to explain the mind, not to alter or improve it. Hume thought that the truth or falsity of his science should have no bearing on practical matters of everyday life. He insists that we will continue to believe and behave as we always have, regardless of the lessons of his philosophy, including lessons that approach to the kind and level of skepticism that so worried the Aberdeen Philosophical Society. Harris argues that Hume's 1775 Advertisement for the posthumous edition of the Enquiry is a direct response to Reid and Beattie for having misunderstood him on precisely this point. Yet, as Harris shows, even if his critics had granted Hume a practically idle skepticism, they would have remained worried about Hume's "complete lack of interest in the deeply traditional conception of philosophy as medicina mentis" (p.161). Harris's excellent contribution illuminates Hume and his critics by providing a context that shows them in true conversation with each other.

Beattie may have rankled his philosophical interlocutors, but his 1770 Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth was a bestseller, wildly popular among an educated general audience. R. J. W. Mills traces the fascinating story of Beattie and his Essay in "The Common Sense of a Poet." In doing so, Mills answers a question so many of us who study this period have long asked: why was Beattie's philosophy, which is not very good and filled with invective, so very popular? He professed to work in the tradition of Reid, using the science of human nature to respond to the dangers in Hume's work, and to secure both morality and religion in philosophy, education, and practical life. Yet, as Mills shows, Beattie's approach was less scientific and more literary, and his response to Hume and the dangers of skepticism were less philosophical and more rhetorical. It's clear that Hume really irritated Beattie, and not just for philosophical reasons. Mills shows that Beattie resented Hume for social, cultural, political, and religious reasons, including the famous Hume-Rousseau affair. The portrait that emerges is a figure many of us will recognize: the professor who discovers a profound distaste for philosophy only after having achieved a reputation that ensures he must remain a philosopher. Mills' expert contribution explains an otherwise puzzling episode in the long and lasting story of the Scottish School of Common Sense.

[1] As Bow notes in his Introduction, the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, also known as the Wise Club, was founded in 1758 and its members included George Campbell, John Gregory, David Skene, Alexander Gerard, Thomas Reid, and James Beattie.