Commonsense Consequentialism: Wherein Morality Meets Rationality

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Douglas W. Portmore, Commonsense Consequentialism: Wherein Morality Meets Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2011, 266pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199794539.

Reviewed by Paul Hurley, Claremont McKenna College


Douglas Portmore's argument in Commonsense Consequentialism can profitably be understood as unfolding in two main stages. He argues in the first stage (chapters 1-3) that a modest form of moral rationalism sets plausibility constraints on acceptable moral theories, and that traditional forms of act-consequentialism make demands that violate such constraints. But once the heart of consequentialism -- not a particular theory of value but a particular conception of practical reason -- is revealed, Portmore argues that it beats true: a plausible moral theory will incorporate this compelling idea of consequentialism, hence a plausible moral theory will be a form of act-consequentialism, properly understood. The second stage, itself presented in two parts, argues first (chapters 4 and 5) that any defensible form of consequentialism will have a particular structure, what he labels a 'dual-ranking' structure, and second for a particular form of consequentialism that has the requisite structure (chapters 6 and 7).

It is well worth the reader's time to accompany Portmore on this journey to the heart of consequentialism and back again: the overall strategy is ingenious, and the arguments are as rigorous as they are provocative. Both the debates within consequentialism and those between consequentialists and their critics are advanced, and Portmore provides the reader with a wealth of new philosophical tools to advance them still further. Because this is a densely packed book, my treatment here will perforce be selective. In particular, I will focus primarily upon the first stage of the argument and the first part of what I have characterized as the second stage -- the argument that consequentialism should have a dual-ranking structure. There is a great deal of philosophical interest in the final two chapters, but accessibility of formulation and presentation is not among their virtues.

Portmore's journey to the heart of consequentialism begins with act-utilitarianism. Such a traditional consequentialist position is committed to evaluating actions as right or wrong, permissible or impermissible, 1) through appeal to outcomes 2) evaluated as better or worse 3) from an evaluator-neutral standpoint 4) appealing to a single ultimate value (e.g., happiness or well-being). He follows recent consequentialists in eschewing the fourth commitment of traditional act-utilitarianism, its commitment to monism, but he also rejects (3), the commitment that many take to be a defining feature of consequentialism -- that outcomes are properly evaluated from an evaluator-neutral, God's eye standpoint. In particular, the bulk of chapter 2 is taken up with arguments defending a modest form of moral rationalism, and demonstrating that traditional evaluator-neutral forms of act-consequentialism run afoul of the plausibility constraints on moral theory established by moral rationalism. Portmore characterizes moral rationalism as the view that "agents can be morally required to do only what they have decisive reasons to do, all things considered." (p. 25) We often, he suggests, have sufficient reason "to act contrary to what we have most moral reason to do." (p. 41) In such cases moral rationalism commits us to denying that agents are morally required to do what they have most moral reason to do. He argues at some length that traditional forms of act-consequentialism run afoul of moral rationalism because they morally require agents to do -- and hence hold agents blameworthy for failing to do -- what such agents lack sufficient reasons to do.

The liberation of consequentialism from restriction to an evaluator-neutral evaluation of outcomes opens up space to accommodate central aspects of commonsense morality that are necessary to satisfy moral rationalism, including moral constraints upon promoting the impersonal good (agent-centered restrictions). In chapter 4, Portmore provides a strategy for consequentializing such components of nonconsequentialism, i.e., for incorporating them into consequentialist moral theories. The strategy, in broad outline, is to "take whatever considerations that, on the nonconsequentialist theory, determine the deontic statuses of actions and insist that those outcomes determine how their outcomes rank." (p. 85) Thus if the nonconsequentialist theory contains an agent-centered restriction against murdering, the consequentialized version will take the higher ranked outcome to be the one upon which, for example, I minimize the murders that I commit, not that upon which I minimize the murders that are committed.

But even if a consequentialized theory can be produced that yields the same deontic verdicts as its nonconsequentialist counterpart, the former may provide a plausible explanation of such verdicts while the latter does not. Why, then, insist upon shoehorning nonconsequentialist theories into such a consequentialized form? Portmore's answer is to argue that any plausible moral theory will be a form of act-consequentialism, hence that any plausible explanation of deontic verdicts will have a consequentialist form. Central steps in his argument can be highlighted by returning to his journey to the heart of consequentialism. We left off with monism and evaluator-neutrality out the door, and act-consequentialism committed only to 1) the appeal to outcomes 2) evaluated as better or worse. But for the evaluator-relative consequentialist (2) as well seems beset with difficulties. After all, minimizing the murders that I commit may not be either better overall (more murders will be committed) or best for me (I might be tortured as a result). The evaluator-relative consequentialist, it seems, must be appealing to a ranking of outcomes not as better or worse overall or as better or worse for me, but as somehow better or worse relative-to-me. But as Mark Schroeder (2007) has argued, it is not clear that 'good-relative-to' in this sense is even a coherent concept.

Portmore's ingenious response to these difficulties confronting any appeal to goodness relative-to-me is to attempt to avoid it entirely -- to argue that it is teleology without goodness, an appeal to the evaluator-relative ranking of outcomes ((1) above) without an appeal to evaluator-relative ranking as better and worse, that lies at the heart of consequentialism. To this end he distinguishes the relationship between rightness and goodness, between deontic evaluations of actions and telic evaluations as good, better, and best, from the relationship between reasons for actions and reasons for outcomes. Virtually all previous consequentialists take these relationships to stand or fall together, and to both be at the heart of consequentialism. It is Portmore's radical suggestion that it is the latter alone, a distinctive conception of the relationship between reasons for action and reasons for outcomes, that is the heart of consequentialism. Thus, his account of the relevant ranking of outcomes readily allows that "sometimes agents have more reason to desire that oi obtains than to desire that oj obtains even though oi is not better than oj." (p. 81)

An immediate benefit of such a position is that it appears to circumvent problems with the appeal to evaluator-relative goodness: consequentialism at its core does not appeal to a notion of goodness relative-to-me, only to a ranking of outcomes that we have more or less reason to desire. Another benefit, by Portmore's lights, is that the teleological conception of reasons, thus understood, is eminently defensible, and sufficient, conjoined with moral rationalism, to mandate act-consequentialism as he understands it. Why consequentialize? Because the heart of consequentialism is the teleological conception of reasons (TCR), understood as the conception upon which reasons for intending to act are determined through appeal to reasons for desiring outcomes to obtain. With moral rationalism, TCR mandates that a plausible moral theory must be some form of act-consequentialism that incorporates central components of commonsense morality, and consequentializing simply is the strategy for incorporating such commonsense components.

These first stage arguments invite many questions. First, does Portmore's teleological conception of reasons avoid the problematic appeal to evaluator-relative goodness relative-to-me? Outcomes, he suggests, are ranked through appeal to the reasons that we have to desire that they obtain. But desires, he allows, are judgment sensitive attitudes, and the judgments to which they are sensitive are typically taken to bring them within the 'guise of the good.' Does problematic goodness relative-to-me then sneak in through the back door? (See, however, his discussion on pp. 64-5.) More fundamentally, if the result is an agent-relative ranking of outcomes upon which those ranked higher are in virtue of that fact better in some relevant sense than those ranked lower, and those ranked highest are best, why isn't this in the relevant sense a ranking as better or worse relative-to-me?

Second, even granting that TCR as Portmore understands it lies at the heart of consequentialism, why accept TCR? Although we routinely invoke reasons that appeal to facts relevant to what is better or worse for each of us (first-personal reasons) and better or worse overall (third-personal reasons), we also routinely seem to appeal to second-personal reasons, reasons to do and not to do certain things, e.g., reasons to keep promises and not to commit murders. Such second-personal reasons seem misinterpreted by the teleological conception, e.g., as reasons to desire that my promise keeping be maximized, or to desire that my commission of murders be minimized.

Portmore attempts to motivate TCR intuitively through appeal to a particular understanding of action, upon which actions are fundamentally understood as "the means by which we affect the way the world goes," (p. 33) hence upon which "what each agent has most reason to do is to bring about the possible world . . . that she has most reason to want to be actual." (p. 33) But such an account of action, although widely defended by advocates of positions like TCR, is also rejected by Aristotelian and Kantian critics, who take it effectively to miscategorize action as a species of production. (See, for example, Korsgaard 2008.) At times he appears to take his version of TCR to capture something intuitive about the relationship between intending and desiring: I intend to act, I desire that outcomes obtain, and my reasons for intending to act and acting, properly understood, are determined entirely by my reasons to desire that outcomes obtain. But significant objections have also been raised against such an account of desire and of the relationship between intention and desire. (See, for example, Thompson 2008, Brewer 2009, and Moran and Stone 2011.)

Portmore's positive arguments for TCR first break it down into three components, then provide arguments for each of the three. TCR, recall, is the position that "S has more reason to perform ai than to perform aj if and only if, and because, S has more reason to desire that oi obtains than to desire that oj obtains." (p. 58) The first two components, TCR-1 and TCR-2, assert the 'if' and the 'only if' claims respectively; the third component, TCR-3, asserts the 'because' claim. Portmore's arguments for the three components clarify the nature of the disagreements between TCR advocates and their critics, but will be unlikely to persuade those who are not inclined to accept such a conception of reasons at the outset.

Consider, for example, his argument for TCR-3, the commitment "to the right-hand side of that bi-conditional having explanatory priority." Portmore argues that the contrasting view, upon which it is the left-hand, 'reasons to do' side that is explanatorily prior, is revealed to be "clearly false" by cases in which "what an agent has reason to do depends on what she has reason to desire." (p. 78) For example, I have more reason to put money in a savings account that yields 2% than in one that yields 1%, because I have more reason to desire that the 2% outcome obtains. But what prevents the opponent of TCR from holding that some such first-personal considerations of what is better or worse for me are relevant, along with third-personal considerations of what is impersonally better and second-personal considerations of various claims that others have upon me to do (and not to do) certain things, in the determination of what I have most reason to do? All such considerations can provide reasons that are relevant to the determination of reasons for action -- the left-hand side of the bi-conditional. To the extent that such an opponent can make sense of an appeal to outcomes the obtaining of which she has most reason to desire, they will be the outcomes that result from performing the actions that she has the most reason to perform. In short, it is unclear why such examples cannot be accommodated by the opponent of TCR into an account upon which it is the left (reasons to do) side of the bi-conditional that in the relevant sense has explanatory priority.

Those who are persuaded by the arguments for TCR and moral rationalism, however, seem to be left with reasons both to accept act-consequentialism and to reject all forms of act-consequentialism that have been put forward to date. What form of act-consequentialism should they accept? Outlining an answer to this question takes up the remaining chapters of the book. Portmore's proposal is to utilize the consequentializing strategy he outlines in chapter 4 to incorporate into act-consequentialism those aspects of nonconsequentialist theories -- agent-centered options, supererogation, the self-other asymmetry, etc. -- necessary to produce a form of act-consequentialism that does not run afoul of moral rationalism. The relevant form of consequentialism must "deny that moral reasons are morally overriding" and accept that non-moral reasons, e.g., of self-interest, can "prevent . . . moral reason . . . from generating a moral requirement." (p. 119) The arguments here are subtle, and make significant contributions to the understanding of both supererogation and agent-centered options.

Consider, for example, agent-centered options, particularly moral options either to act to make things better overall or to act to make things better for oneself. (p. 124) To account for such commonsense options, Portmore argues, a defensible form of consequentialism must allow for cases in which agents are morally permitted to do what they have more moral reason to do (in this case what makes things better overall) and what they have more reason, all things (including reasons of self-interest) considered, to do. The result will be that on such an account "the deontic status of an action is a function of both moral and non-moral reasons." (p. 137) Determinations of moral permissibility must appeal to two rankings, a ranking of outcomes in terms of moral reasons and a ranking of outcomes in terms of reasons all things considered. The resulting view, dual-ranking act-consequentialism, holds that performing some act x is morally permissible for an agent S "if and only if, and because, there is no available act alternative that would produce an outcome that S has both more moral reason and more reason, all things considered, to want to obtain." (p. 118)

He recognizes that such a dual-ranking structure appears to invite Shelly Kagan's worry (1989): if agent-centered options result whenever self-interested reasons, for example, are of sufficient weight on the ranking of reasons all things considered to counter the highest-ranked moral outcome, why isn't the result a rational requirement not to perform the action supported by the weight of moral reasons? The resulting view would seem to hold, bizarrely, that in cases of agent-centered options performing the moral option is always rationally forbidden. Portmore confronts this challenge head on, characterizing it as a manifestation of the more general challenge to accommodate what Raz (1999) labels the 'basic belief,' the belief that typically "the relevant reasons . . . permit performing any of numerous alternatives." (p. 153, quoting Raz) Portmore canvasses various possible solutions and suggests that the most promising supposes that the relevant reasons "are imperfect reasons -- reasons that do not support performing any specific alternative, but instead support performing any of the alternatives that would constitute an equally effective means of achieving the same worthy end." (p. 156) This choice of strategies is somewhat surprising: he eschews (as appealing to "controversial assumptions", p. 198) an alternative strategy distinguishing the rational requiring strength of reasons from their rational justifying strength, but his defense of the analogous distinction between moral requiring strength and moral justifying strength of reasons is central to his argument for a dual-ranking structure. Moreover, Portmore is well aware that others have considered and rejected his preferred imperfect reasons strategy as inadequate to account for a sufficient range of cases.

In response, he locates his account of imperfect reasons within a radically new account of objective rationality that allows the appeal to imperfect reasons to generate many more multiple options cases, and in so doing, he argues, to accommodate the basic belief. There are two central components to this new account of objective rationality. The first suggests that "'ought' implies not only 'personally possible,' but also 'scrupulously securable.'" (p. 172) Without going into detail, I predict that virtually all will agree that whether or not 'ought' implies 'scrupulously securable,' as Portmore claims, it does imply more than 'personally possible' as he characterizes it.

The second central component is both more important to his argument and more controversial. It holds that objective rationality does not directly assess actions, or even most sets of actions. Rather, it "tells us to apply normative principles directly only to maximal sets of actions." (p. 177) It is this feature of Portmore's account of objective rationality ("rational securitism") and of the analogous account of morality ("moral securitism") which entails that "most choice situations are multiple option cases," (p. 183) thereby providing the resources to handle standard objections to an imperfect reasons account of the basic belief. It is one thing, however, and a fairly uncontroversial thing, to maintain that the rationality of certain actions can only be assessed in some sense indirectly, within the context of appropriate sets of actions (an "Across-the-Board Approach"), and quite another to maintain, as Portmore does, that individual actions can only ever be rationally assessed indirectly, within the context of sets of actions, and that even most sets of actions can only be rationally assessed indirectly, within the context of "maximal sets of actions" (a "Top-Down Approach"). Although he takes up several pressing worries about the presuppositions and implications of such an approach at the end of the sixth chapter, such remarks are best read as an opening salvo in any comprehensive defense of the view.

The version of act-consequentialism that Portmore sketches in the final chapter, commonsense consequentialism, combines the moral securitism that he articulates in chapter 6 with the dual-ranking act-consequentialist structure defended in chapter 5. But as Portmore himself readily allows, his defense of rational and moral securitism in no way presupposes TCR or a dual-ranking structure, nor does TCR or the commitment to a dual-ranking structure mandate the particular defense of the basic belief that he presents in the form of rational and moral securitism.


Brewer, T. 2009. The Retrieval of Ethics. New York: Oxford University Press.

Kagan, S. 1989. The Limits of Morality. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Korsgaard, C. 2008. The Constitution of Agency. New York: Oxford University Press.

Moran, Richard and Stone, Martin (2011) "Anscombe on Expression of Intention: An Exegesis," in Essays on Anscombe's Intention, A. Ford, J. Hornsby, and F. Stoutland (eds.). Cambridge: Harvard University Press: pp. 33-75.

Raz, J. 1999. Engaging Reason. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schroeder, Mark. (2007). "Teleology, Agent-Relative Value, and 'Good'," Ethics 117: pp. 265-295.

Thompson, M. 2008. Life and Action. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.