Community and Loyalty in American Philosophy: Royce, Sellars, and Rorty

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Steven A. Miller, Community and Loyalty in American Philosophy: Royce, Sellars, and Rorty, Routledge, 2018, 122pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138570238.

Reviewed by Cornelis de Waal, Indiana University—Purdue University Indianapolis


Steven Miller seeks to connect three American philosophers who the author tells us "appreciated the centrality of community to morality": Josiah Royce, Wilfrid Sellars, and Richard Rorty. In Miller's view, these three figures share enough on this topic to form the beginnings of a tradition, and he subsequently aims "to show the development and inheritance on this topic from Royce to Sellars and from Sellars to Rorty" (3). The interjection of Sellars is needed, at least in part, because Rorty seems to have had only a cursory knowledge of Royce. Miller immediately warns, however, that this is not going to be "an easy and neat story of linear descent." The chapters that follow clearly bear this out, even up to the point of undermining the very idea that we have here the beginnings of a tradition. Miller is aware of this, and he tries hard to show that "the three thinkers are truly addressing the same themes and one another," explicitly identifying his book as "an interpretative project" rather than a more traditional exercise in the history of thought (4). Interpretation is indeed needed since the intellectual climates of Royce, Sellars, and Rorty are quite different. Partly because of this, the three philosophers address different readers, so that even where they defend the same philosophical stance, this may be far from obvious. Such differences notwithstanding, however, I think that Miller's interpretative project is in the end unconvincing for various reasons.

Miller begins with Sellars, the hinge-figure connecting Royce with Rorty, and focuses on his work in ethics and practical reason -- aspects of Sellars that received only scant attention in the literature. The choice of Sellars makes sense because, like Rorty, Sellars became disenfranchised with the mid-twentieth-century analytic tradition -- albeit that he sought to broaden rather than abandon it -- and because Rorty repeatedly paid homage to Sellars. Importantly, Sellars came to reject emotivism (moral claims only express emotions and consequently have no truth-value) seeking an account of morality that "is reasonably faithful to the phenomenology of moral thought and experience" (Miller quoting Sellars, 20). As Miller points out, Sellars's response to the emotivist is that moral judgments are practical, meaning that they stand as reasons for action, and consequently -- in contrast to the emotivist -- they do have truth-value. For Sellars, moral claims express an intention, together with the claimant's practical endorsement of that intention (21f). The problem with Sellars is his insistence that intentions are irreducibly egocentric -- two people cannot even share the same intention. Sellars tries to resolve this by shifting from the "I" to the "we," from the individual to the community, with individuals internalizing the concept of the group, thereby forming an "us" (32). The result is rather tortured, most likely because Sellars maintains a strict separation between individuals and communities. Though Miller explicitly approves of Dewey's claim that individuals are not tossed into communities as marbles in a jar, he too for the most part treats them as such and fails to adequately challenge Sellars on this point. Miller is right, though, to point out that Sellars ends up reverting back to some form of emotivism -- this time with moral emotions being socially conditioned -- and that Royce, with his conception of community and his philosophy of loyalty, can come to the rescue.

Royce, Miller explains, argues that one can act morally only by choosing a cause, any cause, and serving it, being loyal to it. With this Royce means that one should be devoted to that cause, willingly and thoroughly. To further rule out armchair commitments, this devotion should be practical as well, it should work toward concrete outcomes (44f). However, since one can devote oneself to the most heinous of causes, Royce further points out that one can only be truly loyal if one is also loyal to loyalty itself. Presumably this suffices to take all bad causes off the table. Sellars, Miller observes, endorsed loyalty, but not something like Royce's loyalty to loyalty. In its stead Sellars relies on "what ideal reasoners in an ideal community might intend" (49). Roycean loyalty, Miller argues, always implies a community, because, and here he quotes Royce: "If one is a loyal servant of a cause, one has at least possible fellow-servants" (51). In his discussion of community Royce surely trumps Sellars, identifying a community of (shared) memory and a community of (shared) hope, and allowing that in serving a cause one can "adopt the perspective of a community life" (57). The last presumably allows for the "shared intentions" that Sellars rejected. Royce even allows for a universal community, one that is cosmopolitan in that it is a community of all conscious beings, while also concrete, existent -- not ideal, as with Sellars.

This leads us to Rorty. Miller begins with Rorty's claim that how we successfully talk about something determines what it is -- there is no deeper "truth" that somehow captures what something is independently of what we say about it. Consequently, if how we talk about it no longer serves our interests, or if we find a different way that serves us better, we are free to switch our ontological commitments, as in the end those commitments are ours. This means that, for Rorty, our social norms and practices are ontologically prior (70): "All a moral principle can possibly do," Miller quotes Rorty, "is to abbreviate a range of moral intuitions" (72) -- contingently existing moral intuitions, that is. Thus, for Rorty, there is no possibility of falling back on an ideal (Sellars) or universal (Royce) community that can be considered regulative for existent communities. This view informs Rorty's notion of solidarity. Universal values make way for "the polytheism of democracy" where one offers solidarity to a cause pretty much as one falls in love with a person (82f). If that is indeed the ground of solidarity, the problem of negotiating conflicting demands of solidarity -- where one is pulled in different directions, as when in love with multiple lovers -- becomes murky and unpredictable even to oneself.

In his final chapter, Miller tries to bring Rorty and Royce together, even though, as Miller acknowledges, Rorty "did not think much of the merits of Royce's philosophy" (91). Given Miller's claim that Rorty named forced redescription "the worst form of cruelty" (80), the chapter's title, "On the Prospects of Redescribing Rorty Roycely," promises that we may get to see some of that cruelty in action. Miller begins his discussion with an analysis of Rorty's 1995 "Justice as a Larger Loyalty," which intimates a shift from solidarity to loyalty -- a shift, Miller observes, Rorty makes without reference to Royce (92). This raises interesting questions: First, how are solidarity and loyalty related within Rorty's thought; and, second, how do these two relate to Royce's conception of loyalty and to Sellersian we-intentions (one may recall Rorty's frequent use of phrases such as "we Americans" and "we pragmatists"). Unfortunately, none of this is clearly addressed. In part this is because, as Miller explains, "Rorty offers nowhere near a full analysis of loyalty," so that it is unclear what he even means by it (97).

But that can hardly be the whole story. Miller promised us an "interpretative project" (4), and we can surely learn a lot from the contexts within which Rorty uses such terms, even when the terms themselves remain ill- or undefined. What becomes clear, however, is that Rorty dismissed Royce's idea of loyalty to loyalty on the grounds that it is useless (102). In part because Rorty remained stuck in a fairly shallow nominalism, he could only accept as real the concretely individual. For Rorty, even a community is in the end always a concrete, almost tangible, individual community. Now, because a community like "humanity in general" can hardly be called a concrete one, it is not the kind of thing that one can be called upon to be loyal to. You can be loyal to your spouse, to your family, to a street gang, to people whom you encounter and who behave and look like you, to the immigrants down the street, etc., but not to "humanity at large." This not only renders Royce's criterion useless, it undercuts it dramatically. From a Rortian perspective, it is very well possible to be simultaneously loyal to loyalty and engage in ethnic cleansing. As Rorty explained in Truth and Progress (Cambridge, 1998, 167), "Serbian rapists and murderers" considered themselves justified in what they were doing, because they were not "doing these things to fellow human beings, . . . but rather [were] discriminating between true humans and pseudo-humans." That is to say, in the eyes of these Serbian rapists and murderers, Royce's principle simply does not apply to Muslims, and it does not for the same reason that we cannot use it to tell people that they should not eat meat: you can be loyal to loyalty and still eat pork. In The Philosophy of Loyalty, Royce explained that for one's loyalty to be a good one, one must also be loyal to loyalty, meaning that it must simultaneously be "an aid and a furtherance of loyalty in my fellows" (Nashville, 1995, 56). But who exactly are my fellows, and on what grounds do we decide that? This problem, which has to do with the question of what can count as a community, seriously undercuts Miller's attempts to portray Rorty's "Justice as a Larger Loyalty," as a possible bridge to Royce.

Much of the remainder of the chapter is devoted to a critical discussion of "four tensions between Royce and Rorty on the meaning and function of loyalty" identified by Wojciech Małecki (98). Because of these tensions, Małecki argued that Royce and Rorty cannot be considered as belonging to the same tradition -- they are simply too far apart. Miller disagrees, and he tries to counter each tension in turn. Małecki's four tensions can be summarized as follows: Royce embraced rationality, universality, and the loyalty-to-loyalty requirement -- all three rejected by Rorty -- and Royce and Rorty further differed on the public/private distinction. To the first tension, that Rorty rejected the rationalism that Royce embraced, and consequently could not subscribe to Royce's notion of loyalty that depended on it, Miller responds that Rorty was clearly not an irrationalist, and he provides some evidence of that, calling in the help of Robert Brandom. Whether this is enough to bring the two thinkers together, however, remains unclear from what Miller writes.

The second tension relates to Royce's Beloved Community, described by Miller as "the ideal but not realized community toward which [Royce] encouraged us to aim" (100). Rorty's aversion to such abstract monstrosities is already hinted at. In his response, Miller points at Rorty's late flirtations with utilitarianism in which humanity becomes the community of fellow sufferers. Miller does not succeed, however, in making clear whether these avenues into utilitarianism give Rorty something that comes close to Royce's Beloved Community. Dedicated utilitarians -- as Miller admits and Rorty should know -- have pointed out that suffering is hardly confined to humans. The community that Rorty is aiming for includes not only humans, but also cats and dogs, and possibly even lobsters -- and it is not clear how this pans out in terms of loyalty. Need we be loyal to lobsters, and can lobsters be loyal to us? Moreover, it is not clear that suffering is what truly matters here. Would the murderous Serbs referred to above have been true to Royce's Beloved Community had they sought to exterminate Muslims humanely? I think not. It seems to me that suffering and loyalty are two very different things and that a community defined in terms of the former does not automatically lead to one that is defined in terms of the latter.

The third tension is caused by Rorty's rejection of Royce's notion of loyalty to loyalty. This tension, Miller writes, is more difficult to reckon with than the previous two. Miller argues that despite his dismissal of the loyalty-to-loyalty requirement, Rorty does seem to acknowledge that one is sometimes forced to choose between loyalties, and he voices his suspicion that "both Royce and Rorty would think that loyalties must be tested and tried out, in a process of on-the-ground experimentalism" (102). This may be true, but the Rortian is likely to point out that the war in the Balkans was such an on-the-ground experiment, and it is not clear what came out of it. The problem does not seem to be primarily one of conflicting loyalties, as Miller phrases it, but is rather a question of whom to count as fellows -- it is a question of determining to whom loyalty applies.

This brings us to Małecki's fourth and final tension: the public-private distinction. In agreement with his nominalism, Rorty subscribes to a classical (individualistic) liberalism: we are marbles caught in a web of external relations. This guarantees a private life in contradistinction to the public sphere. In the words of Sellars, our intentions are always egocentric. For Royce, in contrast, "selves and communities are so fully interpenetrated that they cannot reasonably be held apart" (102) -- the public and the private cannot be separated. In other words (though Miller does not put it this way) there is a fundamental difference in how both thinkers see the self, which obviously has repercussions on how loyalty can be conceptualized.

Małecki's four tensions pose a big challenge to Miller's aim of showing that Royce, Sellars, and Rorty form the beginnings of a valuable tradition that centers around a communal, or we-inspired conception of loyalty. Though I agree with Miller that "Rorty needs Royce" (105), I'm afraid that I do not find Miller's responses to Małecki strong enough to be convincing. Perhaps Miller should have taken his interpretative project a step further, paying less attention to whom philosophers explicitly pay tribute, and focus more on the relationships between certain sets of ideas that surface within a specific context. An obvious candidate to bring in, besides Dewey, whom Miller intentionally excluded (7), would be Royce's student, George Herbert Mead. Mead, with his philosophy of the act, and his discussion of the relations between mind, self, and society, culminating in his conception of the generalized other, offers much more for developing a robust (naturalistic, contingent) conception of a moral community, enabling a much stronger bridge between Royce and Rorty than Sellars could provide. Mead's naturalistic approach undercuts long-standing metaphysical prejudices and may circumvent many of Rorty's qualms about philosophical abstractions.

In sum, though I think that Miller's argument is in the end unsuccessful, his book is really valuable. It makes us think along less traversed paths, forcing us to reevaluate our ways of thinking, with their heavy reliance on the small set of philosophers that we all too easily gravitate to. It's a book definitely worth reading.