Companions in Guilt: Arguments in Metaethics

Companions In Guilt

Christopher Cowie and Richard Rowland (eds.), Companions in Guilt: Arguments in Metaethics, Routledge, 2020, 232pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138318335.

Reviewed by Luke Elson, University of Reading


The Moral Error Theory says that no positive moral claims (such as ‘murder is wrong’) are true. The most common argument for the theory is that the truth of such claims would involve the existence of objectionably ‘queer’ irreducibly normative or motivating properties (such as wrongness). In Mackie’s words, the queerness point is that it’s ‘in the end less paradoxical’ to reject the truth of positive moral claims than to accept their objectionable implications (1972: 42).

Rather than directly arguing that (1) morality doesn’t really have the claimed implications, or (2) the implications are not so objectionable after all, ‘companions in guilt’ arguments (CGAs) purport to show that some other area of discourse also has those implications. CGAs do not offer a constructive defence of moral properties along the lines of (1) or (2), but they try to put the error theorist on the back foot: either reject the other area of discourse too, or if that price is too high, retain morality. Not all CGAs, as we will see, involve the error theory, but canonical CGAs involve a comparison between moral discourse and epistemic discourse: if moral discourse goes down, it will take epistemic discourse with it.

This book includes an informative introduction and twelve original pieces about CGAs. The papers mostly focus on substantive metaethical debates around particular examples of the argument-form, and even in more general discussions such as the two in the ‘methodology’ section of the book, examples do much of the work. This makes the book hard (but worthwhile) reading. There is no clear message or consensus, so I’ll try to provide a roadmap by describing the main contribution of each piece and offering some brief commentaries.

Hallvard Lillehammer distinguishes two kinds of CGA. What he calls ‘arguments by analogy’ are of the sort I sketched above: they defend the objectivity of ethics by showing that some supposedly fatal problem with ethical discourse isn’t considered a problem—at least not a fatal one—in some other discourse. In ‘arguments by entailment’ on the other hand, claims in some putatively unproblematic discourse entail the truth of some ethical claim. As Lillehammer notes, ‘companionship in guilt by entailment entails companionship in guilt by analogy, but not vice versa’ (23). The argument discussed by Jonas Olson in a later chapter looks to me an argument by entailment.

Lillehammer considers two arguments by analogy, due to Renford Bambrough and Russ Shafer-Landau. The latter is putatively an ‘argument from absorption’ (which exhibits features of both arguments by analogy and entailment): ethics, Shafer-Landau argues, is a species of the genus philosophy, and so inherits many of the central features of philosophy. Whilst admiring the ambition of this argument, I think that Lillehammer is correct to argue that it has ‘no more probative force than standard versions’ of arguments from analogy, which are the canonical examples of CGAs (31).

It seems fine to believe on the basis of testimony that today is Monday, but (somehow) odd to accept that murder is wrong on such a basis. An expressivist argument from deference explains this disanalogy between moral talk and Monday talk by claiming that we don’t accept that murder is wrong in the same way that we believe that today is Monday. Accepting that murder is wrong involves some other kind of attitude, and moral expressivism is correct.

Though her subject is CGAs in general, the crux of Louise Hanson’s argument involves a CGA against the argument just sketched. Hanson claims that it’s ‘just as odd and just as bad’ to accept moral expressivism on the basis of testimony, and that by parity of reasoning with the original argument from deference, this oddness supports metaethical expressivism (i.e., about metaethics itself) ‘to the same extent’ (43). This is an inventive move to the higher order, but I don’t find accepting moral expressivism on the basis of testimony that odd. It’s certainly the sort of thing I might have done as a first-year graduate student in a seminar.

There is some oddness, and both arguments (Hanson’s and the original argument from deference) provide some plausibility juice to moral and metaethical expressivism, but moral expressivism starts from a much higher base. Hardly anyone is likely to accept moral expressivism purely because of the argument from deference, and many of the other reasons to go moral expressivist (such as the plausibility of judgement internalism) don’t seem to apply in the case of metaethical expressivism.

But suppose that deference supports metaethical expressivism. Need this be a problem for the original argument from deference? Expressivism is a notoriously complex area, but it’s not obvious. Why should the moral expressivist be unhappy with getting metaethical expressivism for free? She may even regard it as a victory—an expansion of expressivism to domains outside the moral. There is a brief discussion on p.43, but I suspect that the expressivist has room to maneuver here.

Though I have sketched several responses, Hanson’s ingenious argument is dialectically very rich, and certainly rewards the time taken to work through its complexities. (There is a potentially-confusing typo on p.38, where the list numeral ‘i’ occurs for a second time.)

Richard Joyce argues that insofar as a CGA ‘conflates the error-theoretic position with an argument for it’ (50), the CGA commits a fallacy. As I mentioned above, error theorists are often motivated by queerness arguments concerning the normativity of morality, which sets up a CGA with epistemic discourse. But this is not the only reason to be an error theorist, and so even if the queerness argument is vulnerable to a CGA, it’s not yet been shown that ‘the overall case for the moral error theory is going to have an analogue leading to the epistemic error theory’ (68). Joyce also argues that even a narrow CGA focusing only on normativity will fail.

As a sociological matter, I think that moral error theory is more closely identified with queerness arguments than Joyce acknowledges. I don’t know of any error theorists except Bart Streumer (who resists that term) who aren’t largely motivated by some form of queerness argument (Streumer 2017). So even if Joyce is right that queerness arguments aren’t essential to being an error theorist, and that they alone are not sufficient to establish error theory, without queerness the case for error theory as it is currently accepted by most error theorists is substantially weakened. There is a disanalogy with atheism—a comparison Joyce appeals to at times—in that there are more atheistic arguments on the market, and atheism is less tied to (for example) the problem of evil than error theory is to queerness.

Olson’s fascinating paper responds to Terence Cuneo’s argument that without moral facts, we can’t perform Austinian illocutionary acts such as assertion. Here are the key premises of the argument, which is found on p.74:

(3) It is an agent’s having the rights, responsibilities, and obligations of being a speaker that explains (at least in part) why the count-generation of illocutionary acts occurs.

(5) If the agent has the rights, responsibilities, and obligations of being a speaker, then moral facts exist.

Premise (3) says that a certain kind of right (and so on) is part of what explains how we can assert; premise (5) says that these rights (and so on) involve moral facts. Assuming that we can assert, there must be an explanation for this, and assuming that the relevant explanation isn’t over-determined, the argument is that if there are no moral facts, then we can’t assert. Olson’s main target is (3), and in the bulk of the paper he offers a—convincing, to my eyes—argument that it faces a dilemma concerning what makes a certain utterance an assertion.

I think Cuneo’s argument is not a mainstream CGA, but what Lillehammer called an argument by entailment: it draws out the implications of moral error theory, by trying to show the (in this case, explanatory) indispensability of moral facts in some other domain. We are no longer talking about the collateral damage of an argument for the error theory, but the centrality of morality to our other practices.

Wouter Kalf defends moral error theory against a CGA with prudential discourse, about what is good or bad for us. Prudential discourse is often thought to share the (allegedly) problematic categorical normative features of moral talk. Guy Fletcher has argued that whereas there is a plausible and unproblematic reduction of epistemic discourse (in terms of truth), the same doesn’t look to be the case for either morality or prudence (88-9), and offered a CGA against the moral error theory.

Kalf rejects this CGA, arguing that if there’s an ‘ontologically kosher’ reduction of epistemic properties, then there’s also one for prudential discourse. He also argues that even if the discourses were on a par, a prudential error theory isn’t an unacceptable cost for the moral error theorist, and that a combined error theory can do well in terms of the ‘now what’ question, about what we should do after we reject moral discourse. I will discuss only the first of these threads.

Is there really an undeniable reduction of epistemic properties in terms of truth? Kalf argues not, by appealing to a proposal by Ema Sullivan-Bissett, that ‘we sometimes have an epistemic reason to update our set of beliefs because doing this will enable us to believe true propositions later on, and even though this particular new belief is not true’ (93). He claims that assuming that this view is coherent, so is the view that ‘epistemic reasons can have a different subject-matter than truth’ (96). I found this move a little fast: as Kalf presents it, Sullivan-Bisset’s proposal does involve truth, albeit perhaps long-run truth, and so perhaps the question is not whether epistemic reasons have truth as their subject-matter, but precisely what the connection is to truth. If so, it’s not obvious how far this would undermine the truth-reduction of epistemic discourse.

We now turn to three chapters which discuss the putative analogy between morality and mathematics. I’ll consider the chapters by Justin Clarke-Doane and Ramon Das together, since Das’s chapter is largely a reply to Clarke-Doane.

Clarke-Doane argues for moral (or more broadly, practical) non-cognitivism, by analogy with mathematical pluralism. The core thought behind such pluralism is that every coherent mathematical structure is realised, and so every coherent claim about mathematics is true, albeit about a different intended part of what we might call mathematical-conceptual space. More generally, pluralism about F says that ‘there is a plurality of F-like concepts, all satisfied, independent of human minds and languages’ (106).

Extending such pluralism to the moral realist’s normative properties, we find that (for example) you ought1 to maximise expected utility, and you ought2 to never treat others as mere means, where the subscripts indicate distinct properties or operators. Such plural properties leave unsettled a practical question— what to do?—and so ‘settling the facts, even the normative facts, fails to settle the questions at the center of our normative lives’ (111). And such questions—what to do— are not themselves subject to such an argument, because pluralism about what to do is ‘not so much as intelligible’ (114). Only a kind of non-cognitivism about what to do is left standing. We might have hoped that settling the normative facts would tell us what to do, but probably didn’t hope that settling the mathematical facts would tell us what to do, so the upshot of pluralism is more surprising in the normative case.

Das’s response has several threads, but the main focus is this: if Clarke-Doane is right that moral pluralism leaves unsettled the practical question of what to do, then mathematical pluralism also leaves unsettled the question of what to believe. This is partly because there are far more plural mathematical structures than those used as examples in Clarke-Doane’s chapter, and partly because Das denies that ‘ought1’ and ‘ought2’ denote distinct concepts. I am a little unclear on what the question of ‘what to do’ is—I can sometimes hear it as meaning the same was ‘what should we do’—and thus why pluralism about what to do is unintelligible.

But the Clarke-Doane/Das exchange is extremely sophisticated and I must reserve judgement; I’m not sure what to believe. I must similarly confess a lack of competence to evaluate Anna Bergqvist’s CGA that due to the contingency of conceptions of various concepts, an attack on moral properties will overgeneralise. The core idea is that ‘once we recognise the perspectival nature of moral vision as always originating from within the socio-historical framework or vision of individuals, we must also acknowledge that conceptions of shared concepts in public language are themselves parochial’ (219).

Are moral facts irrelevant to the best explanation of why we have the moral beliefs that we do? Christopher Cowie considers the upshot of a recent move away from construing relevance in modal terms—in particular, the sensitivity and safety of our moral (and mathematical) beliefs.

Daniel Korman and Dustin Locke, and David Faraci have recently argued that the explanatory dispensability of the facts shouldn’t be construed (or shouldn’t be mainly construed) in modal terms, but directly in terms of explanations. Cowie’s main argument is that this move, at least as it has actually been motivated by Korman and Locke and by Faraci, supports something like a CGA: ‘The explanation-first view as motivated above actually sits very nicely with treating moral beliefs and mathematical beliefs as equally susceptible (or not) to debunking’ (145). Cowie’s claim, which I find plausible, explicitly applies only to versions of the explanation-first view which are motivated by ‘simple cases about which we were meant to have simple intuitions’ (148), and not to versions which rest on more complex philosophical foundations.

Daan Evers considers the prospects for a CGA grounded in aesthetic properties, in particular beauty and artistic merit. After a scholarly discussion of the arguments in favour of some kind of non-naturalism about aesthetics—including, for example, that aesthetic judgements at least have a mind-independent phenomenology—he considers two CGAs. The first (161) is that beauty opens the door to mind-independent non-natural value, and the second (163) is that it opens the door to such value and to categorical reasons.

Evers does not regard these CGAs as a particularly promising attack on the moral error theory, but is a little more optimistic about the case in terms of artistic merit than of beauty. I found very little to disagree with in this careful and insightful chapter, but I am skeptical about whether these CGAs will move the moral error theorist. Most error theorists are willing to throw the moral appearances out of the window in pursuit of metaphysical simplicity, and will likely be delighted to throw the aesthetic appearances out too. It would be strange—even for an error theorist—to accept that ‘torturing babies is wrong’ is false but insist that ‘the Four Branches of the Mabinogi are artistically meritorious’ is true, even though there is a murkier path to an evolutionary debunking of the latter.

James Lenman argues that Berkeleyan and other forms of idealism about material objects face problems that quasi-realist ethical pictures escape. He thereby defends the latter against a CGA, by stressing disanalogies between quasi-realism about ethics and idealism about the external world. First, there is a well-worked out realist epistemology in the perceptual case, but the realist ethical view—intuitionism—is at best sketchy about moral epistemology (181).

To see the second disanalogy, consider a ‘quasi-realism about the external world’, an idealism where natural science is a feasible endeavour, because ‘whether we take it to be material or mental, the material world is an orderly place . . . full of patterns and uniformities’. This idealist picture is ‘strained’ because though it constructs a gigantic (according to natural science) universe out of the mental, the mental is just one part of that universe—moreover, a tiny part (178–9). Lenman claims that there is no such strain or tension (of which issues about the size of the cosmos are one version) in the ethical case.

I was struck by the similarities between Lenman’s description of the problem and a criticism often levelled at quasi-realism: in starting from our subjective attitudes to construct putatively objective evaluations of everything—including those attitudes—the picture also looks somewhat strained. If in the ethical case only an outright inconsistency (or acceptance of subjectivism) will undermine the project, why not in the perceptual case too?

Richard Rowland defends Sarah McGrath’s ‘conciliationist’ argument for moral skepticism against the CGA that it leads to other skepticisms. Conciliationism tells us that, subject to several caveats, if an epistemic peer disagrees with us about some claim p, then this undermines any claim to knowledge we might have that p. The challenge for the moral skeptic is to specify these caveats so that they undermine moral knowledge, but not (for example) mathematical or geological knowledge.

Rowland discusses the caveat that if my view is more qualitatively parsimonious than yours, then the fact that you disagree doesn’t undermine my knowledge (192). Though this does strike me as correct, it’s not obvious that in all cases the scientific view will be more parsimonious than the young-earth creationist one, especially if we consider geology to be part of a broader scientific enterprise that includes, for example, the spookiness of quantum mechanics.

The other caveats are that: (i) you have unanswered arguments for p and objections against your peer’s arguments that not-p; (ii) you have a plausible error theory for your peer’s beliefs, but there isn’t one for your beliefs. In ethics, meeting this standard might always be a temporary success—applied ethicists ‘should know that a smart grad student will soon tear their arguments to pieces’ (199)—but if anything this understates the problem for morality, given the comparative rarity of holding a philosophical view without being uncomfortably aware of counter-arguments of one’s own creation. Insofar as this issue generalises to philosophical thought more broadly, it is the flip side of Shafer-Landau’s argument discussed by Lillehammer.

By way of conclusion and recommendation: I learnt a huge amount about particular debates from reading this book, and anyone with an interest in the forefront of contemporary metaethics is likely to find at least one extremely useful and engaging chapter in it.


I am indebted to the authors of papers in this volume and others who have read drafts of this review and corrected misconceptions. All errors that remain are mine.


Mackie, J. L. (1977). Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. Penguin.

Streumer, Bart (2017). Unbelievable Errors. Oxford University Press.