Comparing Kant and Sartre

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Sorin Baiasu (ed.), Comparing Kant and Sartre, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 262pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137454522.

Reviewed by Henry Somers-Hall, Royal Holloway, University of London


As Jonathan Head et al. note in the introduction to this volume, while there is growing interest in the connections between Sartre and his German idealist heritage, until recently, work actually addressing the connection between Sartre and Kant has been scarce. This volume aims to begin to explore Sartre's debts to Kant, and while it is not the final word, it provides a useful collection of essays that pick up various intersections between the two. The collection is organised into four sections: an introduction, which provides a useful survey of the current state of research into the interrelation of Kant and Sartre, followed by sections on metaphysics, metaethics, and metaphilosophy. This organisational schema is rather loose, largely because these categories bleed into each other within Sartre's own work, and this is particularly true in the metaphysics section, where essays tend to deal with metaphysics in relation to the ethical concerns of Kant and Sartre. Within these sections, the essays take a number of different approaches. As well as exploring Sartre's explicit references to Kant, a number of the papers use Sartre's moral psychology to resolve problems in Kant's system, and a number explicate areas of Sartre's thought by reference to transcendental idealism more generally.

Sartre's relationship with Kant is rather ambivalent. In The Transcendence of the Ego, for instance, he takes up Kant's account of the transcendental unity of apperception as a foil against which to criticise Husserl's transcendental ego, and Being and Nothingness goes on to develop a constitutive view of the world that is reminiscent in some respects of transcendental idealism. Similarly, Existentialism is a Humanism presents an ethical account that includes a universalism resonant with Kant's moral thought. Despite these parallels, Sartre is critical of Kant throughout his work, particularly Kant's account of time and his inability to explain the other, and Sartre's move to phenomenology appears to lead him to reject the kind of transcendental idealist approach that Kant puts forward at root. For the most part, the collection deals with the affinities between Kant and Sartre, though there is some exploration of their differences, and Sartre's criticisms of Kant's thought.

The very helpful introduction sets out the current state of scholarship on Kant and Sartre. This is followed by a selection of essays somewhat surprisingly entitled 'metaphysics' given Kant's ambivalent relationship to the word and Sartre's contrast of metaphysics with phenomenology. The first paper in this section is Sorin Baiasu's own, where he compares Kant's transcendental unity of apperception with Sartre's notion of consciousness. Baiasu takes up Sartre's citation of Kant's claim that the 'I think' must be able to accompany all of our representations in the Transcendence of the Ego in criticising Husserl's positing of a substantial transcendental ego. Baiasu's discussion of the connections between Kant and Sartre is informative here, and he sets out clearly some responses to objections to his thesis by Christian Onof, another contributor to the volume. To highlight the difficulties of separating the ethical from the metaphysical in Sartre and Kant, Baiasu's background aim is to provide an account of personal identity sufficient for morality. The theme of self-knowledge is returned to at various points throughout the volume, as one would expect given Kant's work in the paralogisms and the importance of bad faith for Sartre's thought. Jumping ahead to the section on metaethics, Leslie Stevenson's paper draws out the extent to which for both Sartre and Kant, self-knowledge appears as something of a regulative ideal. Similarly, Justin Alam takes up Sartre's analysis of bad faith to attempt to demonstrate how it is possible for a free rational Kantian subject to choose to act in accordance with a maxim of radical evil. Alam uses Sartre's notion of bad faith to argue that taking up a maxim of radical evil involves a self-deceptive policy on the part of the moral subject whereby they take the evil maxim to be the principle of freedom. These three papers provide a useful analysis of the similarities of Kant and Sartre on the nature of experience, and of the possibilities of using Sartre's phenomenological account to augment Kant's moral theory.

While these papers all make a contribution to seeing the affinities between Kant and Sartre, it would have been helpful to have explored in more detail some of the differences in the constitution of experience and self-knowledge between them as a counterpoint. As Deleuze notes, for instance, Sartre's claim that the transcendental field is impersonal marks a radical move away from Kant, and Sartre's claim that consciousness is unified transversally, without the need for something like a transcendental unity of apperception, differs markedly from Kant's account in the transcendental deduction, and would have been worth considering in this context.

Continuing with the papers on metaphysics, Daniel Herbert explores Sartre's critique of Kant's account of temporality, providing a very clear account of the points where Sartre is critical of Kant. Thomas R. Flynn's paper provides an excellent account of the Kantian influences on Sartre's theory of the imagination. Tracing the importance of the imagination for Sartre from his thesis to his 1964 Gramsci lectures, Flynn notes some important influences of Kant, drawing an interesting parallel between Kant's ideas of pure reason and the Sartre's account of the imagination, and how even Sartre's most Kantian ethical formulations in Existentialism is a Humanism oppose Kant's rational formalism to a model based on the 'image of man as we think he ought to be.' The section concludes with a paper by Onof exploring the possibility of using Sartre's ontology to augment Kant's account of freedom, relying on the ontologically ambiguous status of being-for-itself for Sartre. The paper captures an important strand of the collection in attempting to leverage aspects of Sartre's work to solve difficulties within Kant's philosophical system.

Moving to the section on metaethics, Peter Poellner provides an excellent 'rational reconstruction' of Sartre's account of action. While the paper does deal with Kant, its principal interest lies in a clear analysis and exposition of key tenets of this area of Sartre's thought. Having already looked at the papers dealing with self knowledge in this section, we can move to the final paper, which explores further Sartre's criticisms of Kant including his criticisms of Kant's ethics as formalist. Against the formalism of Kant's categorical imperative, Michelle R. Darnell focuses on happiness as an indirect duty in Kant's moral theory to show that there is a place in Kant's moral work for a more concrete understanding of our moral lives. We might question whether such a reading of Kant really resolves the issues for Sartre, or whether putting too much weight on happiness in Kant pushes him away from a theory of autonomy. Similarly, Darnell's suggestion that we might see Kant's kingdom of ends as a way of adding a more interpersonal element to Kant's thought runs into difficulties when related to the rather problematic manner in which our projects come into conflict for Sartre. Nonetheless, the paper does present a more nuanced way of reading Kant's moral philosophy.

The final section, dealing with metaphilosophy, begins with an excellent analysis by Katherine Morris about the nature of the descriptions provided by Sartre throughout his philosophical works. Morris focuses on the purpose behind the famous examples introduced by Sartre in Being and Nothingness, such as Pierre's absence from the café, or the example of the shame of the man looking through the keyhole. Morris asks whether these examples should be read as providing descriptions that form the basis for transcendental arguments, or whether they have a more Wittgensteinian basis in leading us to rethink the nature of these experiences themselves. While the former reading relies on the certitude of the experience as the basis for an inference, the latter promises to remain truer to Sartre's phenomenological heritage and its rejection of the kinds of dualisms that transcendental arguments rely on. While Morris can only sketch the model she puts forward in the paper, it is a very promising account. As with several of the papers, Morris doesn't deal with Kant's notion of the transcendental specifically, though the paper is a worthy contribution nonetheless. The final paper by Richard E. Aquila considers Kant and Sartre to share a metaphysical model called transcendental phenomenalism that holds phenomena to both be real existents, but also appearances within an infinite series of existents. While there are clear parallels between Sartre and Kant here, as Baiasu notes in his introduction, there is a danger of equivocating between terms across these philosophers which cannot be fully addressed in a piece of this length.

The aim of the volume is to provide a comparison of Sartre and Kant, and most of the papers focus very much on convergences between the two. There are of course striking divergences as well, and it would have been interesting for the collection to address some of these. It might be argued, for instance, that Kant's kingdom of ends displays the kind of epistemological or ontological optimism that Sartre accuses Hegel of, downplaying the conflictual and perspectival nature of existence. Similarly, the notion that the world is organised according to our projects, and that these may well prove to be incommensurate with one another, provides a rather sharp divergence from Kant's moral philosophy that would have been worth exploring in more detail. There is also little work on Sartre's texts after the 1940s, aside from Flynn's analysis of the Gramsci lectures, and the near absence of any analysis of possible connections in their writings on aesthetics or politics. Nonetheless, the collection provides an important resource for those interested in the connections between Kant and Sartre, and does an excellent job of showing the continuities in thought, and influences of Kant on Sartre. It also effectively demonstrates how -- even removed from their context within Sartre's system -- many of Sartre's phenomenological insights can serve to expand our understanding of the world.