Compassionate Moral Realism

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Colin Marshall, Compassionate Moral Realism, Oxford University Press, 2018, 265pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809685.

Reviewed by Adam Lerner, New York University


Why be moral? In his book, Colin Marshall develops a novel answer: being moral comes along with obtaining an irreplaceable epistemic good available only to those who feel compassion. He then parlays this answer into a version of moral realism meant to deliver every metaethical good worth wanting: a naturalist metaphysics, a rejection of relativism, a refutation of skepticism, an explanation of the intimate connections between moral judgment and moral motivation, and, above all, a compelling answer to the question "why be moral?". The arguments for these views draw inspiration from an eclectic array of sources, both historical and contemporary, and they fruitfully bring together a variety of issues from across the philosophy of mind and moral philosophy. While the arguments may leave the reader with a host of questions and objections, this is the mark of a generative research program that deserves serious attention.

The argument for being moral proceeds in two steps. First, Marshall argues that there is an irreplaceable epistemic good -- being in touch with other beings' pains, pleasures, and desires -- that well-functioning agents can obtain only if they feel compassion and act morally. Second, he argues that if this is so, there is a satisfactory answer to the "why be moral?" question.

Officially, a subject S is in touch with property P of object O just in case:

  1. O has P
  2. S has a representation of O in which
    1. O is phenomenologically given, and
    2. P is revealed to S. (p. 53)

To better understand these conditions, consider some variations on a familiar case. First, "Assume that colors are real properties of objects, and imagine that Mary lacks normal color vision. She therefore does not have redness revealed to her in her experience of a red rose" (p. 76). Thus, she is not in touch with the redness of the rose.

Now suppose Mary can't see the colors of items that lie beyond the tip of her nose. So she sees a distant rose as colorless. "When she faces [the] red rose, however, she sees red in the tip of her nose, which is in fact rose red" (p. 76). While rose-redness is now revealed to her, and the rose itself is phenomenologically given, she remains out of touch with the redness of the rose. Why? Because the rose-redness revealed to her is not revealed to her via her representation of the rose. It is revealed to her via her representation of her nose.

Marshall tells us that epistemic goods are "all ways of getting the world right, grasping how things are, representing truly, correctly appreciating reality, as well as certain types of justification and virtue that are connected to those accomplishments" (p. 29). And while he doesn't define "irreplaceability", he characterizes the phenomenon by noting that it is reasonable to remain upset at the loss of a friend even after making a new friend, but it isn't reasonable to remain upset by the loss of a mass-produced toy after purchasing a new one (p. 30). These remarks suggest that for a good to be irreplaceable is for it to be reasonable to be upset by its loss, whatever else one gains in exchange.

So why think that being in touch is an irreplaceable epistemic good? Marshall appeals both to an extension of Locke's theory of ideas (Chapter 2) and to intuitions about cases (Chapter 3). For example, he considers Leila, who in Studio 3 lacks eyesight but develops the ability to have some veridical perception-like experiences of a studio's layout via human echolocation. He contrasts Leila in Studio 3 with Leila in Studio 2, who lacks this echolocation as well as eyesight but gains both propositional knowledge of and an ability to imagine the studio's layout. Marshall writes: "If my sole desire were to have a full grasp of the world around me, I would rather be like Leila in Studio 3 than like Leila in Studio 2. In other words, I want to experience how things are, not merely be able to deduce and accurately imagine how they are" (p. 52).

It's unclear whether the intuitions that Marshall appeals to establish his conclusion. First, it's unclear how widely held they are. Second, we shouldn't trust these intuitions unless we can find some explanation of why being in touch would be an epistemic good. This is the first gap in Marshall's argument: he provides an incomplete account of what makes being in touch an epistemic good.

Perceptual states that put agents in touch are often thought to play an important role in justifying, licensing, or providing warrant for beliefs about the contingent properties of objects. However, this isn't what Marshall has in mind, since he thinks being in touch is an epistemic good even when it doesn't improve the epistemic status of our beliefs. Instead, he claims that being in touch is "necessary for fully grasping reality" (p. 161). Out-of-touch people "cannot face the truth" (p. 2), "cannot fully face reality" (p. 157). They are "missing something" (p. 18, p. 33, p. 59, p. 157).

If fully grasping reality requires being in touch, but not because being in touch confers positive epistemic status on beliefs, then why does fully grasping reality require being in touch? A natural explanation is that being out of touch compromises our ability to form certain beliefs in the first place. It compromises our ability to conceive of certain ways the world might be. If so, there must be some properties we can think about only while experiencing those properties. But this is highly controversial (Sundström, 2011). Even those who believe in what David Chalmers calls "direct phenomenal concepts" -- concepts that allow us to represent phenomenal properties by simultaneously instantiating those phenomenal properties -- often believe we have other "standing" phenomenal concepts that allow us to represent the same properties when we are no longer instantiating them (2003, p. 271; cf. "non-fundamental" uses of phenomenal concepts in Block, 2007, pp. 282-283). But even if we grant this or some other explanation of why "fully grasping" the property of some object may require simultaneously experiencing that property, Marshall still owes us an explanation of why agents are epistemically better off if the object with the property is phenomenologically given and the property is revealed to them via their representation of that object.

Assuming this gap can be closed and being in touch is an irreplaceable epistemic good, completing the first step in Marshall's argument requires showing that well-functioning agents can obtain this good only by being compassionate and acting morally. To argue this in Chapter 4, Marshall relies on the following case:

Wombat 1: Rahman and Rupert are taking a walk. They see a wombat that is struggling to free its injured leg from a vicious steel jaw trap. Rahman is pained by the sight and feels moved to help. Rupert, not pained at all by the sight, steps back to watch Rahman with cool curiosity. (pp. 39-40)

Rahman is compassionate in virtue of being pained by the sight of the wombat and being moved to help. He is well-functioning in virtue of having his "affective states ['felt motivations'] manifest in action, in proportion to their intensity" (p. 233). And he acts morally in virtue of acting in accordance with "one paradigm of a morally good person" (p. 40) on which "moral goodness is about alleviating suffering, promoting pleasure, and helping satisfy desires" (p. 147).

To show that well-functioning agents can obtain the epistemic good of being in touch only if they are compassionate and moral like Rahman, Marshall must show:

(i) By feeling compassion for the wombat, Rahman is in touch with the wombat's pain.

(ii) It's impossible for any well-functioning agent to be in touch with the wombat's pain unless he feels the kind of compassion that leads him to act morally.

There's significant reason to doubt that both claims can be true, and this constitutes the second gap in Marshall's argument for being moral. Even though Rahman meets conditions 1 and 2a for being in touch with the wombat's pain, it's unclear whether he meets 2b, which requires the wombat's painfulness to be revealed to him via his representation of the wombat -- for Rahman's pain to represent the wombat as pained. To argue for this, Marshall draws on both Schopenhauerian phenomenology and imperatival theories of pain (Martínez 2011; Klein 2015). Using the latter, he argues that Rahman's state represents the wombat as pained in virtue of having imperatival content that corresponds to the imperatival content of the wombat's pain -- whereas the wombat's pain has the content "Hey you, change this state in your foot!", Rahman's pain has the complementary content "Hey you, change that state in that foot!" (p. 78)

In addition to using this claim to argue for (i), Marshall also uses it to argue for (ii). It is because those who are in touch with the wombat's pain must have a state with such imperatival contents that they must have a motivation that (if well-functioning) leads them to help the wombat. But this claim is susceptible to an objection that Marshall recognizes, and the way Marshall responds to it may secure (ii) only at the cost of undermining (i).

The objection is that imperatival contents (e.g., "salute the general!") cannot be directly evaluated in regard to how closely they match reality (p. 79), which they must be if being in touch is "a way of getting reality right" and being in a state with imperatival content can put one in touch (p. 3). In response, Marshall concedes that the imperatival content "Get rid of that state!" can only be evaluated for truth when embedded within descriptive contents (e.g., "To heed the demands of the wombat's pain, you must . . . ") (pp. 79-80) But then this seems to imply that when Rahman experiences a state with the imperatival content "Get rid of that state!", this can count as representing the wombat as pained only because it is embedded within the descriptive contents of a belief (e.g., a belief that to heed the demands of the wombat's pain, you must . . . ). But if we need to embed Rahman's compassionate pain within the descriptive contents of a belief in order to secure (i), this may undermine (ii). To see why, consider:

Wombat 2: Same as Wombat 1, but instead of Rupert, Rahman is accompanied by Ruphurt. Ruphurt, upon seeing the struggling wombat, feels excruciating pain in his own leg, of exactly the sort he would feel if his own leg were stuck in the same sort of trap as the wombat's. Ruphurt knows that his perfectly healthy leg is not actually stuck in a trap, though. (p. 74)

As Marshall concedes, Ruphurt's state more closely resembles the wombat's state in some respects: "his state reveals that property to him in a much fuller way than Rahman's experience of the wombat does" (p. 74). Moreover, only Ruphurt's pain shares the de se structure of the wombat's pain. Nonetheless, Marshall claims that Ruphurt must be epistemically worse off than Rahman because "his representation of the wombat does not reveal the relevant property" (p. 74). But it's unclear why. If Rahman's representation of the wombat reveals the painfulness only because the imperatival contents of his compassionate pain are embedded within a belief (i.e., a belief that to heed the demands of the wombat's pain, you must . . . ), why can't Ruphurt's self-directed pain represent the wombat as pained if embedded within a belief (i.e., a belief that from the wombat's perspective, it feels like [this])? If it can, then we have a counterexample to (ii) and thus to Marshall's claim that well-functioning agents can obtain the epistemic good of being in touch only by feeling compassion and acting morally: Ruphurt is a well-functioning agent who gets more of the irreplaceable epistemic good and isn't motivated to act morally.

Assume this second gap in the argument for being moral can be closed. To complete the first step of the argument, Marshall must show that well-functioning agents who feel compassion will act morally not only in simple cases, but across complex cases involving non-present individuals (Chapter 5) and multiple individuals with different types of affective states (Chapters 6, 7, 8).

Marshall's argument here assumes we can simultaneously feel compassion for many via "long-range compassion" (p. 4). He offers various heuristics for discovering what long-range compassion would motivate us to do, and he uses these heuristics to provide compelling arguments for thinking that long-range compassion could allow for partiality (Chapter 8), deontic side constraints (Chapter 7), and not helping sadists, masochists, and bigots in typical cases (Chapter 9).

Despite characterizing long-range compassion with these heuristics and visual metaphors about "zooming out", the nature of long-range compassion remains elusive (p. 118). This generates the third gap in Marshall's argument for being moral. The claim that well-functioning agents with long-range compassion would act morally is true only if such agents are possible. But it's unclear whether they are, because it's unclear what it would be for there to be such agents -- it's hard to conceive of an agent who simultaneously instantiates numerous states similar to the affective states of numerous individuals across numerous times and possible worlds, and which reveal the numerous properties of those states via numerous phenomenologically given representations of those individuals. This remains so even if -- as Marshall argues -- the intensity, duration, and quantity of the compassionate states can be compressed "in a proportional way" while leaving the compassionate agent in touch to a significant degree (p. 119).

Consider now the second step in Marshall's argument for being moral: showing that if being moral comes with obtaining this irreplaceable epistemic good, we thereby successively answer the question "why be moral?" Marshall motivates the claim by finessing similar claims by Plato, William Wollaston, and Arthur Schopenhauer (Chapter 1), and he adds support by providing various explanations of why we might care to obtain such epistemic goods (Chapter 10). However powerful these considerations are, the view faces three problems.

First, Marshall recognizes that in sufficiently complex circumstances, humans could never be in touch with everyone affected by their actions (p. 133). This reveals a significant limitation of his argument for being moral: since humans cannot obtain the epistemic good that would lead well-functioning agents to act morally in these cases, he has no argument for being moral in these cases.

Second, it's unclear whether humans can instantiate what Marshall calls "compassion" for even one individual. Rather than resembling the negative valence of those who are suffering, the emotional states that lead people to alleviate suffering are often slightly pleasant (Ashar et al., 2017; López-Pérez et al., 2014; Genevsky & Knutson, 2015; Genevsky et al., 2013). And while Marshall cites neuroscientific studies showing overlap between areas of the brain active during first-hand pain and vicarious pain, subsequent studies have revealed little shared neural circuitry (Krishnan et al., 2016).

Lastly, we can be in touch without acting morally if we forgo well-functioning. Since acting morally often requires personal sacrifices, why not get the epistemic goods and avoid the sacrifices by (e.g.) taking a drug -- the Intention-Stopper -- that allows us to feel compassion but temporarily undermines our ability to act in accordance whenever we do? This question reveals that in addition to showing we have reasons to be in touch, answering the "why be moral?" question requires showing that we have reasons to be well-functioning and that these reasons together outweigh our reasons to act immorally.

Many agents lack actual or idealized desires that would be satisfied by remaining well-functioning whenever feeling compassion. They would come to have such a desire while feeling compassion -- the desire to help -- but they lack that desire when deciding whether to take the Intention-Stopper. So they have no desire-derived reason to refuse the Intention-Stopper. That means Marshall must posit some nonderivative reason to be well-functioning to explain why we should refuse the Intention-Stopper. Unfortunately, in the wake of Kolodny (2005) and Broome (2007), most philosophers doubt we have nonderivative reason to instantiate structural coherence relations of the sort that constitute well-functioning.

Nevertheless, assume we do have reason to be well-functioning while feeling compassion. Does this reason, together with our reason to be in touch, supply a satisfactory answer to the "why be moral?" question? Marshall's stated goal is merely to show that moral people are not "dupes" (p. 6), so answering this question to his satisfaction doesn't require showing that rationality compels morality. It merely requires showing that our reasons to be in touch and well-functioning are no weaker than our reasons to be immoral. But it's difficult to evaluate this, because it's unclear how strong these reasons are.

A background assumption Marshall could be making is that if being in touch is an irreplaceable epistemic good, then the value of being in touch is incommensurable with the other values people sacrifice when acting morally. If so, this implies that it's rational to prefer a sufficient amount of being in touch with others' affective states to the loss of any amount of other goods -- even other types of epistemic goods, like textbook-based propositional knowledge or being in touch with other objects and properties. But this isn't obvious.

In the remainder of the book, Marshall devotes most of his attention to the following metaethical claim, which he takes to be a non-obvious analytic truth:

Bad Enough: Something is objectively bad if any subject who was in touch with it would feel averse to it. (p. 226)

In Chapter 11, Marshall argues that if a metaethical view meets three criteria (epistemic, semantic, and metaphysical), then it deserves the label "moral realism". Earlier chapters provide grounds for thinking Bad Enough meets the epistemic criterion (i.e., "All paradigmatically bad people, but not all paradigmatically good people, lack some irreplaceable epistemic good") (p. 226). In Chapter 12, Marshall plausibly argues that Bad Enough, along with the assumption "Some pains are such that any subject who was in touch with them would be pained by them" implies both the semantic criterion (because it implies "Some pains are objectively bad" is literally true) and the metaphysical criterion (because it implies the fact that some pains are objectively bad holds "independently of any contingent stance") (p. 226). He also defends Bad Enough against open-question style objections, but in doing so merely helps himself to David Lewis's appeal to semantic indecision and semantic variation (Lewis, 1989).

In Chapter 13, Marshall uses his account to provide a novel explanation of the intimate connections between moral judgment and moral motivation. He also provides a short discussion of how his view makes sense of moral perception. In Chapter 14, Marshall explains how we can know particular moral truths and provides a convincing explanation of why the analytic status of Bad Enough renders our knowledge of it immune to evolutionary debunking arguments. He also argues that moral disagreement poses no threat, but the arguments here rely on resources familiar to the analytic naturalist.

In Chapter 15, Marshall ultimately offers us a kind of ideal observer view:

An action is morally wrong just in case a maximally morally virtuous agent who could prevent that action from happening would prevent it (in the simplest case, by not performing it). (p. 230)

What makes Marshall's moral realism compassionate -- and distinguishes it from existing ideal observer theories -- are the traits of the ideal observer, which include being fully in touch with (and thus compassionate towards) others. If Marshall's view has any advantages over other versions of analytic naturalism, they reside in how it secures connections between moral judgment and moral motivation and explains immoral people's epistemic defects.

While Marshall's arguments have important gaps and depend on controversial assumptions, this is inevitable for any view as systematic, ambitious, and philosophically rich as the one presented in Compassionate Moral Realism. Marshall's exhilarating book makes it required reading for anyone interested in moral motivation and the moral and epistemic significance of compassion.


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