Complicated Presence: Heidegger and the Postmetaphysical Unity of Being

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Jussi Backman, Complicated Presence: Heidegger and the Postmetaphysical Unity of Being, SUNY Press, 2016, 342pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438456485.

Reviewed by Michael Bowler, Michigan Technological University


Jussi Backman has produced an insightful, nuanced, well-written, cogently argued, and thoroughly researched interpretive account of Heidegger's philosophical pursuit of the question of Being. Backman argues that there is a basic continuity to Heidegger's thought. Depending upon where they fall on this and related issues, Heidegger scholars will be more or less sympathetic to his account and find his arguments more or less persuasive. Regardless, I think most will find this book a valuable and insightful read and, whether they agree or not, will recognize that Backman's account is an important one that deserves to be reckoned with.

One great virtue of the book is the remarkable clarity with which Backman explicates some of the most difficult elements of Heidegger's thought, including among others the ontological difference, Ereignis, and the fourfold. The book is by no means an easy read as it is densely argued and deals with very difficult issues.  Nevertheless, given the turgid nature of so many of the Heideggerian texts he is dealing with, Backman manages to give a refreshingly lucid exposition - although I shall have something more to say regarding this in my critical comments at the end. Given this I believe that this book would also be a valuable read for those not so well-versed in Heidegger's work, but well-trained in the history of philosophy, especially classical metaphysics, who wish to introduce themselves to the entire span of Heidegger's philosophy.

There is a long-standing discussion in Heidegger scholarship as to whether there is a radical rupture (or ruptures) in Heidegger's work or whether it is a continuous development in a basic philosophical project. Backman argues for the latter, seeing Heidegger's thought as beginning with his early engagement with the metaphysical (in Heidegger's sense) account of Being as exclusively the indeterminate and most universal unity that is the pure, meaningful presence of a being as originally articulated by Parmenides. In this regard, Being is solely and exclusively tied to beings, i.e., it is the beingness of beings. Being as the meaningful presence of a being admits of no division or difference and what is outside of or different to being as meaningful presence is simply nothing.

Backman's account ends with Heidegger's articulation of the "postmetaphysical" understanding of beyng (Seyn) as the "event or the taking-place of singular and unique historical situations and instances of meaningfulness." (127) More fully, this event of singular and unique historical meaningfulness consists in the unity in difference (or "tensional unity") of a foreground presence and a nonpresent, contextual background, the effect of which is the singular, unique, unrepeatable, meaningful complicated presence of a being. In Backman's words,

Presence is thereby to be grasped as nothing other than a reference to the withdrawing background dimensions. In return, the nonpresent background is not something that subsists independently of the foreground of presence, but is rather there only in and through this reference. We see that this tensional unifying, referring, and exceeding structure of a unity that does not exclude difference and opposition but is precisely based on them is again precisely what we have designated as complicated presence. (138)

The bulk of the book consists of giving a detailed account of Heidegger's continuous progression from point A (the metaphysical account) to point B (the postmetaphysical account), with expansive discussions of each major stage of this progression. I will only be able to provide a barebones sketch of this, which is unfortunate since many of Backman's valuable insights into Heidegger's work are manifested and exhibited in the details of his analyses and arguments.

Backman begins with Heidegger's familiar account of metaphysics as ontotheological and its end or the beginning and end of the "first inception.  "Metaphysics begins with Parmenides' claim that thinking and being are one, which on Heidegger's reading, amounts to the notion that there is a univocal sense of Being and it is meaningful presence, i.e., the "Is there" or "There is." Meaningful presence is a pure, indeterminate unity that excludes all possible difference, including temporal difference. Thus, outside of Being there is nothing or, literally, no-thing. Yet only through this pure, indeterminate unity is there a determinate being.

Plato and Aristotle approach the question of Being through beings, thus inaugurating the ontotheological approach that characterizes metaphysics or the "first inception" to its end in Nietzsche. In this regard, Being is what characterizes in common or most universally all beings, in this case determinate meaningful presence. Every being is a determinate and meaningful being and what determines beings and grounds their meaningfulness is what they are, namely, for Plato an eidos or Idea. Importantly, this approach preserves the unity of being, for although each Idea is different from other Ideas, an Idea is the common, constant, univocal, intelligible, determinate meaningful presence of all its many instantiations. In this respect Ideas are more "beingful" than their instantiations. Plato further argues that the Idea of the Good is the most "beingful" of all since it is the most common, constant, intelligible, determinable meaningful presence. Consequently, we have the beginnings of the ontotheological approach to the question of Being, namely, finding what is common and general to all beings by means of a supreme being. However, Plato resisted making the Idea of the Good into a being.

Aristotle explicitly articulates the ontotheological approach by arguing that in their being all beings make reference to a particular supreme being, namely, Aristotle's God, which is thought thinking itself. This is an important step for the development of metaphysics for a number of reasons, but particularly because the supreme being is now characterized by eminent self-presence. Modern metaphysics' turn toward subjectivity recognizes that eminent self-presence is to be discovered in subjective being which is uniquely present to itself. This turn is apparent, for example, in Descartes and Hegel though in importantly different ways, since, Hegel but not Descartes understands absolute self-presence to be a finite, historical process. Nietzsche recognizes that self-presence is ultimately an act of willing oneself, which represents the end of metaphysics.

What follows is Backman's interpretive account of Heidegger's transition from the end of metaphysics to an "other inception" or a postmetaphysical approach to the question of Being. This begins with an increasing recognition on Heidegger's part of the complicated nature of the unity of being or of meaningful presence, namely that foreground meaningful presence is made possible by a nonpresent background context. Backman traces how Heidegger then delves more deeply into this nonpresent background context, including the emergence in his thought of the notion of the fourfold of earth, sky, mortals and gods. Backman argues that, in the end, Heidegger comes to recognize that the postmetaphysical approach must focus upon the unified tensional difference that unites foreground meaningful presence and the nonpresent background context. Heidegger also articulated foreground presence in terms of beingness, presence, unconcealment, or truth of beings (130); and background context in terms of the sense of being, the nothing, truth of being, or concealment (130), understood as beyng or "the event of the differentiating interplay between unconcealment and concealment" (130) or the ontological difference as such.

The first step is accomplished in Heidegger's work up until the late twenties. As with Plato and Aristotle, Heidegger believes that the sense of being must be approached through beings and one exemplary being in particular, Dasein, the being who understands being. However, unlike Plato and Aristotle, Heidegger argues that the exemplary being is not the universal, infinite, supreme being, but rather the concrete, temporal, finite being Dasein. In explicit opposition to ontotheology, Heidegger engages in what Backman calls an ontothnetology. Moving away from the ousiaology of metaphysical ontotheology, the exemplary being in the case of ontothnetology "is not a thing, but rather a process: the event or happening (Geschehen) of existence (Existenz)." (75) Backman says, "The distinctive feature of the exemplary being is no longer absolute self-sufficiency, but rather the finitude of a mortal being (Greek thnētos)." (76) Dasein is characterized not by self-sufficiency but "self-excess" as manifested and exhibited in the fact that the existence of Dasein as a self is an ecstatic unity of timeliness (Zeitlichkeit) for which the present meaningful presence of a being is always conditioned by the nonpresent background context of Dasein's "being-ahead-of-itself" or, more literally, "forthcoming" (Zukunft) and "already-having-been" (Gewesenheit). Metaphysics had excluded this background by assigning it to nothingness. Already the complicated nature of meaningful presence is arising. From this Heidegger hoped to work out the temporality (Temporalität) of being that is the horizonal correlate of Dasein's understanding of being. That is, there is an "ecstatic-horizonal correlation of Dasein and World." (96) Finally, Heidegger believed that his early project would culminate in a reversal (or "turn") of this approach such that once temporality was worked out, a temporal account of Dasein and its understanding of being would be possible. Ultimately, Heidegger realizes that this reversal or turn cannot be adequately accomplished in the manner of and in the terminology laid out in Being and Time.

The recognition of the failure of his early project allows Heidegger to see that what he hoped to achieve could only be accomplished if he gives up on approaching meaningful presence and its nonpresent background context ontically by means of the analysis of the exemplary being Dasein and its understanding of being. Rather, what is needed is an analysis of the event (Ereignis) of the ontological differentiation of being and beings (the ontological difference) as such or beyng, a term which in his late philosophy Heidegger will dispense with altogether by simply referring to Ereignis. More exactly,

Historical and singular situatedness can no longer be limited to Dasein's openness to meaningful presence. Meaningful presence as such is rather given as historically situated. A "systematization" of any "ideal" or "universal," i.e., supratemporal structure of "being as such" becomes inconceivable when beyng itself is articulated as the event or the taking-place of singular and unique historical situations and instances of meaningfulness. (127)

This project culminates in Heidegger's formulation of the fourfold, the development of which Backman traces in great detail through a number of important texts including Contributions to Philosophy, Introduction to Metaphysics, and On the Origin of the Work of Art, at one point giving an interesting and suggestive analogical connection between the fourfold and Aristotle's four causes.

I will have to skip over the details of Backman's account of the development of the fourfold, but it is a significant portion of the book, in which he provides many interesting insights and connections. I do want to point out that Backman interprets the fourfold as embodying ecstasies of time in Being and Time by means of the relation of mortals (the already-having-been, which consists of the historical and cultural context that characterize the background context) and gods (the "forthcoming," which embodies the purposive relevances that character the background context). However, following the work of Jeff Malpas, Backman argues that the other elements of the fourfold, i.e., earth and sky, bring into account the spatial "ecstasies" of the background. Interestingly, he argues that sky represents the constancy embedded in the singularity of the event of meaningful presence that was inappropriately captured by the notion of an Idea, whereas earth represents particularity replacing the also inadequate notion of materiality.

Dasein still plays a role in the account, although no longer as human being as such but rather as Da-Sein, the there-being made possible by the event of beyng, although it is also through human being that Da-Sein is realized. At this stage, the event or beyng is further elaborated as the reciprocity of the giving of presence by the fourfold and the receiving of presence by human being.

The final chapter covering Identity and Difference represents, among other things, a fascinating analysis of the ramifications of Heidegger's reflection on unity, identity and difference wherein he distinguishes between the metaphysical reduction of unity, difference and identity to equality in opposition to the postmetaphysical notion of sameness and selfsameness that allow for a robust account of unity in difference.

There is unfortunately much that I have had to leave out in my description of Backman's excellent book. In the space left I would like to briefly raise a critical note. This is the omission of a discussion of the role of language in Heidegger's later philosophy. Backman admits that his treatment necessitates leaving out many aspect of Heidegger's philosophy. However, the role of language is not an unimportant or extraneous element if one wishes to give an account of the postmetaphysical unity of being or of complicated presence. Language is famously for Heidegger the "house of being" and is a unity in difference, namely, a "gathering together" that produces meaning. Moreover, it is an example of what Backman terms complicated presence. As Heidegger remarks in The Way to Language, "Language speaks by saying; that is, by showing" (Basic Writings, 411) and it shows both in what it says (presence, unconcealment) and does not say, i.e., when it speaks "silently" (nonpresence, concealment). Moreover, Heidegger also notes that language reciprocally connects being and human being (418), which certainly pertains to the reciprocal giving and receiving of presence. Consequently, this seems to be a topic that would deserve Backman's attention if he wishes to give a full account of the overarching thesis of his book. Given Backman's careful and insightful analyses of those elements of Heidegger's thought are present in the book, I would have been eager to read his thoughts on Heidegger's notion of language.

More importantly, Backman's success in providing an account of the continuity of Heidegger's thought relies heavily on his explicating language and terminology from Heidegger's later thought, for example, concerning the fourfold, by means of language and terminology of his earlier thought and, in some cases, even the language and terminology of ancient philosophy, such as the four causes. His ability to do so might -- and I emphasize might -- rely heavily on his not accounting for the role of language in later Heidegger. Given his later understanding of language, the fact that Heidegger uses the language of mortals, gods, earth and sky would be important and it would perhaps prevent any connection to and thus any explication by means of the earlier language he employs such as "already-having-been" and "forthcoming".  The same would apply to the language Backman uses, e.g., historical and cultural context and purposive relevances. I take it that the profound significance of language for Heidegger, combined with the varying language or terminology he uses during different stages of his thinking, is one of the reasons many authors suggest radical rupture(s) in Heidegger's thought. Notwithstanding, this book is highly recommended.