Complicity and Moral Accountability

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Gregory Mellema, Complicity and Moral Accountability, University of Notre Dame Press, 2016, 163pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268035396.

Reviewed by John Gardner, University of Oxford


Gregory Mellema’s short and lively book on the ethics of complicity, while decidedly a work of analytical philosophy, is ‘aimed at an audience that includes nonphilosophers’ (14). It has no notes, a limited bibliography, and thirteen bite-sized chapters. For the most part I found it easy and fun to read, powered as it is by piquant examples of everyday wrongdoing involving multiple agents. The primary and official focus of the book, as its title suggests, is on the situation in which wrongdoing by one agent (the ‘principal’, in this review ‘P’) is supported by another (the ‘accomplice’, in this review ‘A’). However, the book also attends (especially in chs 3 and 6) to some cases of collective or group agency which are not naturally classified as complicity cases. It engages, too, with other nearby topics such as cooperation (ch 9) and conspiracy (ch 12). Mellema is excellent at revealing subtle connections among these topics. But he is not so good at providing orientation. His book is oddly organised, with no obvious rationale for the way in which material is sequenced. Meanwhile the (presumably deliberate) paucity of references means that valuable opportunities are missed to relate what is being said to a wider range of philosophical literature.

That is not to say that Mellema ignores previous writings on complicity itself. On the contrary, each of Thomas Aquinas and Christopher Kutz has the honour of a chapter to himself (chs 2 and 3 respectively). H.D. Lewis and Karl Jaspers, representing opposite poles of radicalism about complicity — minimalist and maximalist respectively — share a chapter between them (ch 10). It is not clear that these ad hominem chapters represent optimal use of the limited space in the book. Let me qualify that: chapter 10 is a terrific read, full of testing and vexing thoughts. It is marred only by the fact that it comes too late to disabuse the reader of the comfortable bourgeois intuitions that are largely confirmed earlier in the book. The chapters on Aquinas and Kutz, by contrast, are intrinsically unsatisfying. They contain too much summary and too little (forthright) criticism. Quirks in each author’s scoping of the subject of complicity are thereby allowed to enter unchecked into Mellema’s own frame of analysis. Aquinas does not attach enough importance to the distinction between contributing to another’s wrongdoing on the one hand and contributing, on the other hand, to the wrongdoer’s getting away with her wrong or succeeding in her further purposes in committing it (‘complicity after the fact,’ as the common law calls it). Kutz, meanwhile, blends the puzzles of complicity prematurely into the puzzles of collective and group agency (foregrounding, e.g., the position of corporate shareholders and that of individual combatants in war). Mellema does too little to expose the difficulties to which these two moves give rise. His own positions and arguments, throughout the book, suffer from resulting contortions.

For example: Mellema wisely rules that ‘Apart from a contributing act, one cannot be complicit in the wrongdoing of another’ (68). Yet, with Aquinas’s taxonomy still in mind, he holds that A who ‘covers for’ (134) or ‘fails to denounce’ (68) P’s wrong could in principle be complicit in P’s wrong. How? Obviously it is too late now for A to contribute to P’s original wrong, which is ex hypothesi done. A is now contributing, if to any wrong by P, then to a second wrong that P has not yet finished committing — say, that of evading justice in respect of her first wrong. Why say that this is A’s complicity (‘after the fact’) in P’s first wrong, rather than A’s complicity (‘before the fact’) in P’s second wrong? Mellema’s book would have been easier to follow, and closer to the truth, if he had gone for the second analysis and abandoned the whole idea of complicity ‘after the fact’ as a lawyer’s confusion. He could likewise have made the book simpler and sounder by keeping Kutz-inspired worries about corporations and their shareholders, armies and their soldiers, etc. completely out of the way until the more rudimentary cases involving an individual P and an individual A had been fully explored and analyzed. Ch 6 (on collective and shared responsibility), ch 9 (on well-integrated actions), and ch 11 (on indirect accomplices) could in my view have been more helpfully clustered towards the end of the book. Reflections on Kutz’s important but specialized contribution could equally have been reserved to that part of the book, instead of muddying the waters so near to the start. Mellema’s first instinct is right: the problems of collective and shared agency are only ‘tangentially related to the notion of complicity’ (41).

Aquinas and Kutz both contribute to expanding Mellema’s topic, somewhat awkwardly, beyond its natural boundaries. On another axis, however, Mellema strikes me as having artificially narrowed his topic and thereby relegated it, wrongly, to the sidelines of moral philosophy. He assumes from the start that ‘morally blameless complicity’ is an oxymoron (3). While this assumption does not strictly bar him from discussing justifications and excuses for (what would otherwise be) complicitous actions, it does license him to put these topics ‘beyond the scope of the discussion’ (15). So when questions come up that would usually be thought of as questions of justification or excuse (e.g. duress at 69, moral dilemmas at 81-2), they are rather cursorily parried or bypassed. Largely untreated in the book, therefore, are intriguing (and classic) problems about the moral position of undercover cops, anarchist judges, agents provocateurs, press-ganged conscripts, etc., who contribute to the wrongs of others so as to (as it seems to them) serve some greater good or avoid some terrible evil.

There is a connection here, I think, with Mellema’s paucity of references. It has been a central question of modern moral philosophy whether one could be justified, or at least excused, in contributing to another’s wrongdoing in order to avoid being a principal wrongdoer oneself. Think of Kant’s case of the murderer at the door, Williams’ example of Jim and the Indians, Sen’s story of Ali, Donna, and the bashers, and so on. Should one choose to be A rather than P in such cases, even when all else is equal? Mellema opines that, with some exceptions, Ps are more blameworthy than their counterpart As (5-6). But that question lies a long way downstream from the one that interests Kant, Williams, and Sen. If blameworthiness were the immediate issue for potential accomplices, then folks like Jim and Donna could breathe a sigh of relief. All they need is an excuse to relieve them of blame (as Mellema seems to agree: 15). In their dire situations that excuse will not be hard to find. Since they are deliberating about what to do, however, what Jim and Donna want to know is whether being A rather than P would be justified, not merely excused. Mellema does not isolate this upstream question. That leaves him giving the impression that there has not been much recent philosophical work on complicity, when in fact moral philosophy has been preoccupied with it for decades. On this score, I was struck by the contrast with Chiara Lepora and Robert E. Goodin’s 2013 book On Complicity and Compromise (not cited by Mellema) in which puzzles about the ethics of complicity are presented as pervading modern moral and political philosophy, albeit not always under that name (sometimes as ‘the problem of dirty hands’ or ‘the Solzhenitsyn principle’).

In spite of these difficulties with its scope and intellectual horizons, Mellema’s book does give pride of place to what is surely the key question for any study of the ethics of complicity, namely the question of what counts as contributing to another’s wrong. In the two chapters which in my view have the most solid claim to appear in it (chs 4 and 5), Mellema attends to enabling and facilitating contributions respectively. As his economical and lucid remarks nicely bring out, each of these raises puzzles for the idea of a ‘contribution’. If A sells P a rifle that P uses in an assassination, A enables the assassination. But what if there are other dealers around who would have sold P a similar weapon had A not been willing and able to do so? Likewise, if A gives P advice as to the ideal vantage point from which to fire the fatal shot, A facilitates the assassination. But what if, even without A’s advice, P would have found an adequate vantage point? In each case there is clearly a sense in which what A does make a difference to P’s wrongdoing, and another sense in which A doesn’t.

Mellema has sensible thoughts about what the former sense might be and why it would be the one that matters in identifying a complicitous contribution. But his analysis does not delve as deeply as that of some who went before him. It does not, indeed, display much awareness of previous delvings. In particular, there is no mention of the detailed investigations of H.L.A. Hart and A. M. Honoré in their joint book Causation in the Law (1959, 2nd ed. 1985). True, Hart and Honoré did not venture many views on the ethics of complicity. Their interest lay mainly in the metaphysics — principally, indeed, in the same question that detains Mellema in chapters 4 and 5, the question of how one can be said to contribute to the wrongs of others by facilitating those wrongs, by enabling them, or for that matter by inducing them, encouraging them, permitting them, failing to prevent them, etc. One does not expect Mellema to rival Hart and Honoré for encyclopaedic treatment of these issues. But perhaps one could have wished for some engagement with their work. One might also have hoped for chapters on encouraging, inducing, and some other modes of contribution, to match those on enabling and facilitating. In some ways, as Mellema reveals in scattered, tantalising remarks on the subject, the problem of complicity by encouraging is the most complex and intriguing of them all. And the problem of complicity by failure to prevent, to which Mellema gives repeated but not sustained attention, is perhaps the one with the most far-reaching implications.

Inevitably this review has emphasized some themes of Mellema’s book to the neglect of others. Given more space I might have discussed Mellema’s novel distinction between accomplices who are responsible for the principal’s wrong and accomplices who are merely ‘tainted’ by that wrong (27-9). I might also have discussed his attempt (ch 8) to distinguish breach of moral obligation from disappointment of moral expectation (which is said to be ‘wrong’ yet not ‘forbidden’: 88). I found much to inspire and intrigue as well as to provoke in these passages, as indeed in the whole of the book. To repeat, it is an agreeable and stimulating read. Yet I cannot conceal my frustration that so many issues only ‘tangentially related to the notion of complicity’ vie for the reader’s attention within the short span of Complicity and Moral Accountability. They do so, it seems to me, at the expense of methodical and tenacious attention to the book’s ostensible topic. Some nonphilosopher readers may thereby come to underestimate the contribution that philosophy has made, and is capable of making, to the study of complicity — and indeed vice versa. For such readers, the Lepore and Goodin book mentioned above would, I believe, be a better place to start. It is just as short and just as replete with memorable examples (theirs mainly concern humanitarian intervention in conflict zones, which is Lepore’s day job). However, Lepore and Goodin do a better job than Mellema of sticking to the advertised topic and locating it correctly (namely: dead centre) on the map of modern moral and political philosophy.