Concept Audits: A Philosophical Method

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Nicholas Rescher, Concept Audits: A Philosophical Method, Lexington Books, 2016, 184pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498540391.

Reviewed by Nathaniel Goldberg, Washington and Lee University


Nicholas Rescher has written a book short in both length and content. Regarding length, the book is shorter than its already short 183 pages suggest. It has 38 chapters, each from one to eleven pages. Often the text stops before the bottom as the next chapter begins on a new page. Regarding content, in an 8-page introductory chapter Rescher proposes the philosophical method of concept auditing, in a 3-page concluding chapter reviews it, and in the intervening 36 chapters applies it. Little analysis is given of concept auditing, and not much more is given of any particular application thereof. Rescher's goal seems instead to provide as many examples of it as possible.

What is concept auditing? Rescher explains that it is

a certain distinctive methodology of philosophical investigation [whose] . . . aim is to determine if the treatment of a given philosophical issue has made appropriate use of the conceptual resources afforded by the pre-systematically established employment of the relevant concepts. (p. 3)

While financial auditing is meant to ensure that all financial business has been appropriately managed, concept auditing is meant to do the same for conceptual business. Further, concept auditing is meant to proceed in three steps. One first examines "the proprieties of ordinary-language terms," then infers "on this basis the principles standardly at work in this usage," and finally applies "these findings to check that justice has been done to these principles in the philosophical deliberations at issue" (p. 3). Rescher himself applies this method to such concepts as, or those contained in discussions of, "neo-Platonic wholes" (ch. 3), "existence" (ch. 13), "certainty" (ch. 24), "luck versus fortune" (ch. 34), and "perfection" (ch. 37).

Someone familiar with 20th-century Anglophonic philosophy might wonder how concept auditing relates to ordinary-language philosophy, as exemplified by Wittgenstein (1953/2009) and J. L. Austin (1961/1979, 1962/1979). Rescher never really says. In chapter 8 he writes that a "good example of concept auditing emerges in the work of the Oxford philosopher John L. Austin" (p. 33), who he notes belongs to the ordinary-language tradition. But the blurb presumably written by Rescher on the book's back cover claims that concept auditing "is based on an innovative premise for philosophers." That might make it seem as if concept auditing is based on a currently innovative premise. Rescher does claim in the Preface that his book's "aim is to answer the question of what remains of 'ordinary language philosophy'" (p. ix). Yet he says no more than that.

Concept auditing is interesting. My worry however is not merely that Rescher should have given its historical antecedents more mention. It is also that his not doing so does his discussion a disservice. Since nearly the entire book is an application of a method that should seem familiar to many of its readers, those same readers would benefit from knowing how Rescher thinks concept auditing relates to ordinary-language philosophy. Regardless of how they relate, though, is Rescher right about what he says about concept auditing itself? In the remainder of this review I consider two objections to what Rescher says about it, consider how he says it, and close with an overall evaluation.

The first objection is this. Rescher claims that concept auditing is an important philosophical method because

the philosopher has really no alternative but to respect the ground rules of ordinary usage -- principally for two reasons: (1) because it is in relation to those meanings and usages that the problems of philosophy arise, and (2) because no matter what innovations and variables he would like to introduce it is in terms of those meanings and usages that he will have to give his initial explanations of what he is proposing to do. (p. 3)

Below I say something about Rescher's default to the masculine pronoun. My point here is that (1) is either false or misleading, while (2) does not illuminate anything about philosophy specifically.

(1) is false if Rescher means the claim categorically. Not all philosophical problems arise in relation to ordinary usage. When Kant (1783/2010) tries to solve the philosophical problems of how pure mathematics, natural science, and metaphysics are possible, those problems arise in the context of the (apparent) apodictic certainty of Newtonian mechanics rather than ordinary usage. Perhaps Rescher means (1) non-categorically, though it is impossible to tell. Further, since -- given the ensuing 36 middle chapters of application -- the categorical reading seems the natural one, if (1) is not false then it is misleading.

(2) meanwhile applies to all disciplines. Though Kant's philosophical problems just considered do not arise in relation to ordinary usage, he does give his initial explanations in terms of such usage. And yet Newton himself does the same, as his first definition exemplifies: "The quantity of matter is the measure of the same, arising from its density and bulk conjointly" (1687/1999, p. 403). Others in the natural sciences, those in the social sciences, and others in the humanities beside philosophers, give initial explanations in terms of ordinary usage too. So (2) is true across the board. Perhaps Rescher means that philosophy, unlike (e.g.) science, relies on only ordinary usage. Philosophers of physics however rely on both ordinary and scientific usage, and mutatis mutandis the same is so of philosophical specialists. But then (2) remains so broad as not to be particularly helpful for Rescher's project.

My second objection concerns who adjudicates what counts as ordinary usage. Are philosophers by themselves the best people to do so? Rescher himself seems to smuggle his own philosophical views into his auditing. He writes: "To be, in the most general sense of the term, is to play some part in such a realm of interrelated items, and there are as many modes of being as there are identifiable realms of meaningful deliberation" (59). It is unclear how this is ordinary usage, unless he means ordinary philosophical usage. But that would undercut his method. Even in cases where Rescher goes from concept auditing to philosophical deliberation proper, he smuggles things in. He asserts that "in philosophical deliberation the most central and salient mode of existence is being as a concrete object in the real world as part of the observable furnishings of the physical universe" (p. 60). That would be news both to Plato, who took abstract objects to be (or, better, have) the most central and salient mode of existence, and to Lewis, who took all such objects -- as well as their counterparts in other possible worlds -- to be (or have) equally central and salient modes of existence, because they are all equally real.

These are not meant as ad hominem attacks against Rescher. Recall that concept auditing is meant to proceed in three steps: (a) examine the proprieties of ordinary usage; (b) infer based on this the principles behind this usage; and (c) determine whether philosophical deliberations respect these principles. A philosophical education should train one to be able to perform (b) and (c). Regarding (a), things are less clear. All philosophers might occasionally smuggle their own views into concept auditing. Moreover, mixing metaphors, we might say that Rescher has philosophers examine proprieties of ordinary usage from our armchairs, when armchair views are problematically limited.

Fortunately there is a ready remedy. Instead of armchair reflection on ordinary usage, philosophers could determine such usage, or rely on those who did determine such usage, in the field. Experimental philosophy, as developed by Joshua Knobe and others (e.g., Knobe 2003, and Knobe and Nichols 2008), is a philosophical method that employs empirical techniques to investigate philosophical intuitions. Such techniques include surveys, functional magnetic-resonance imaging, and other physiological or behavioral measures. Philosophical intuitions have been used as data for conceptual analysis. There is no reason that experimental philosophy cannot investigate ordinary-language usage, which philosophers can then use to reveal the proprieties of ordinary usage. (a) thereby strengthened, philosophers could then use their own training to proceed to (b) and (c).

Hence, even if both my objections stand, concept auditing remains redeemable. On the first, if Rescher means his claim non-categorically, then he is right. Many philosophical problems do arise in relation to ordinary usage, as the middle chapters of his own book attests. And this is so regardless of what else Rescher says about the point -- and regardless too of how disciplinarily general or specific such auditing ultimately is. On the second, if concept auditing is made more empirical, then it is less likely to be biased. Experimental philosophy seems especially suited to help.

The book suffers from poor copy-editing.  Pronoun usage makes pianists, swimmers, pilots, and drill sergeants all male.  "Catch-23" should be "Catch-22".  There are garbled sentences ("The point is that if when philosopher purports", p. 10).  In the second-last paragraph, we are told that "concept auditing admits of two special modes of application" but only one is mentioned.  In the Introduction "concept conditioning" (p. 4) and "perceptual auditing" (pp. 3-4) seem to be used as synonyms for "concept auditing", but neither term is explained or ever used again.

What then is my overall evaluation of this book? While some of what Rescher writes and how he writes it leaves something to be desired, there are things to be gained by reading his book. Evaluating how much is to be gained however recurs to my opening remarks. The book is short in length and content. There would have been more things to be gained had Rescher lengthened his explanation of concept auditing itself.[1]


Austin, J.L. 1961/1979. Philosophical Papers, ed. J.O. Urmson and G.J. Warnock, Oxford University Press.

-- -- -- . 1962/1979. Sense and Sensibilia. Oxford University Press.

Kant, Immanuel. 1783/2010. Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, tr. Gary Hatfield. In Theoretical Philosophy After 1781, 29­­­-170. Cambridge University Press.

Knobe, Joshua. 2003. Intentional Action and Side Effects in Ordinary Language. Analysis 63: 190-3.

-- -- -- and Nichols, Shaun. 2008. Experimental Philosophy. Oxford University Press.

Newton, Isaac. 1687/1999. Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica, tr. I. Bernard Cohen and Anne Whitman. University of California Press.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1953/2009. Philosophical Investigations. Wiley-Blackwell.

[1] Thanks go to Mark LeBar for feedback.