Conceptions of Set and the Foundations of Mathematics

Conceptions Of Set And The Foundations Of Mathematics Book Cover

Luca Incurvati, Conceptions of Set and the Foundations of Mathematics, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 238pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108497824.

Reviewed by Øystein Linnebo, University of Oslo


Set theory is widely regarded as the foundation for (nearly) all of mathematics. This raises the question of what a set is and what sets there are. According to the famous iterative conception, sets are "formed" in stages: we start at stage zero with some individuals, or nonsets; at stage one, we form all sets of individuals; at stage two, we form all sets of objects available at stage one; and so on, as many times as we can make sense of.

Luca Incurvati has written the first book-length discussion of what a conception of set is and might do for us, and of how the iterative conception fares vis-à-vis its main rivals. The result is an important contribution to the philosophy of mathematics. The discussion is very well informed, technically as well as philosophically, and characterized by a desire to be balanced and always to give the underdog a fair hearing. The book provides an excellent introduction not only to the well-known iterative conception of set, but also -- more unusually -- to a wide range of rivals, such as the naive conception, the idea of limitation of size, Quine's often maligned New Foundations (NF), and the graph conception. As a result, the book is a valuable resource both for researchers in the philosophy of mathematics and for teaching purposes.

Its main theses can be summarized as follows. (1) A conception of set can justify set-theoretic axioms, but only if the conception is "correct". (2) To be "correct", a conception must fare better than its rivals with respect to certain theoretical virtues. (3) A stronger case can be made for various rivals to the iterative conception than is generally admitted. (4) In the end, however, the iterative conception prevails, outperforming its rivals with respect to the relevant theoretical virtues. The book can thus "be read as an extended argument for the iterative conception of set and hence for any axioms which are justified on this conception" (218).

I now wish to zoom in on some parts of the book that are particularly noteworthy, often in a positive way, but occasionally also negatively. Chapter 1 provides a useful distinction between the concept of set and conceptions thereof: a conception goes beyond the concept by offering a (possibly partial) answer to the question of what it is for something to fall under the concept of set (13). Thus, it is possible for two theorists to possess the concept of set while disagreeing about the best conception of set. The obvious Quinean worries are acknowledged and partially addressed by admitting that the distinction between concept and conception need not be sharp and that both can shift over time. This partial defense may well suffice for the purposes of the book.

Following Penelope Maddy (1990) and others, Incurvati distinguishes two main families of conceptions of set (or collection). Combinatorial conceptions "characterize" a collection "by reference to its members" (31), whereas logical conceptions do so by reference to a predicate or property that provides a membership criterion. The iterative conception, especially as understood by Gödel, is a combinatorial one, as it "takes a set to be an object obtainable by iterating the set of operation" (22), or, as Gödel also puts it, "the operation 'set of x's'". The archetypical logical conception is the naive one, whose unrestricted set comprehension schema allows any condition ϕ(x) to determine a set {x: ϕ(x)}. Paradox-prone and therefore problematic, this conception is correctly ascribed to Frege -- though Dedekind too might have been mentioned as a companion in the guilt.

Chapters 2 and 3 provide a clear and useful discussion of the iterative conception, addressing its motivating ideas, various formal developments of these ideas, the important question of which axioms the conception sanctions, and some challenges to the conception. I particularly enjoyed the superb critical discussion of George Boolos' charge that the iterative conception fails to sanction several key axioms of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory (ZFC). Incurvati defends a more up-beat view. Likewise, there is an excellent discussion of the objection that the iterative conception illegitimately presupposes a prior account of ordinals in order to specify how far the "process of set formation" should be iterated. Incurvati counters the objection by developing Gödel's "autonomous" account of the hierarchy of sets, where the ordinals are generated alongside sets.

How should we understand the talk about sets being "formed", which figures at the heart of the iterative conception? Only constructivists can take this talk literally -- but are thereby also precluded from accepting the large infinite sets introduced by Cantor. Several philosophers (including Kit Fine, Charles Parsons, and Michael Potter) therefore propose to understand the idea of a set being "formed" after its elements in terms of metaphysical dependence: while a set depends on each of its elements, the reverse dependency does not obtain. Incurvati prefers a "minimalist" version of the iterative conception, which attempts to eschew any appeal to a substantive relation of dependence between a set and each of its elements. The desire to eliminate idle metaphysical wheels is laudable. He is therefore right to challenge those who invoke metaphysical dependence to show that this notion does genuine explanatory work. Can the challenge be met? Incurvati is doubtful. He critically discusses my (2008) proposal that x depends on y iff any individuation of x must proceed via an individuation of y. Of course, this proposal presupposes that the notion of individuation earns its keep, e.g., by figuring in an account of permissible mathematical definitions, of our cognitive access to mathematical objects, or the like. Whether or not this presupposition is satisfied, however, remains open to debate.

Next, what is it for a conception of set to be "correct"? Incurvati proposes that the question be answered by a method of "inference to the best conception", understood by analogy to inference to the best explanation (65, fn. 38). He is not entirely explicit about the criteria for what counts as a good explanation. The iterative conception's claim to correctness is said to be based on its providing "a convincing explanation of the paradoxes whilst showing how (most of) the axioms of standard set theory can be true" (65). I find it odd to appeal in this way to justifying "the axioms of standard set theory" as opposed to a more general desideratum of giving rise to valuable mathematics. Moreover, why favor, to this extent, the single conception that scores highest with respect to the criteria? Although Incurvati professes to be open to "a moderate form of pluralism" (219), his proposed method seems biased against more liberal approaches (e.g., Maddy (1990)'s) which happily allow several conceptions to be "correct", perhaps serving different mathematical and foundational needs. Incurvati's idea appears to be that set theory is to serve as a foundation of mathematics and that it is part of the "job description" of any such foundation to subsume or replace all competing foundations. If so, it would be good to hear more.

Chapter 4 provides an admirably open-minded discussion of a strategy for reviving the naive conception by replacing classical logic with a much weaker paraconsistent logic, which allows certain contradictions to be true (e.g., that the Russell set both is and is not an element of itself) without thereby trivializing the theory by entailing every sentence whatsoever. Incurvati considers several attempts to carry out this strategy, showing that they enable one to retain the naive set comprehension schema only at the cost of giving up other principles that are at least as intuitive (e.g., the inference rule of modus ponens), while typically also resulting in a set theory that is too weak or unwieldy to serve as a foundation for mathematics.

In Chapter 5, Incurvati explores a different cluster of attempts to revive the logical conception. First out are some attempts inspired by the Quinean "principle of minimal mutilation": just delete those instances of set comprehension that are inconsistent or, alternatively, identify maximal consistent families of such instances. Through a series of astute mathematical observations (some joint with Julien Murzi), Incurvati conclusively buries both attempts. Next, there is the idea of limitation of size, often associated with Cantor, i.e., that a property determines a set provided that it doesn't have too many instances. Although this idea fares much better, Incurvati finds it disappointing that it "ultimately rest[s] on the fact that supposing that certain properties determine a set leads to paradox" (150). He might have added that the abstraction principle that encapsulates the idea of limitation of size has wildly non-isomorphic models, which represents a failure to articulate a genuine conception of a universe of sets (cf. Jané and Uzquiano (2004)). Finally, Incurvati considers my (2018) attempt to develop a version of the Dummettian idea that only "extensionally definite" properties determine sets. This discussion is marred by a technical error on p. 155, which leads to the mistaken belief that this account makes the universal property extensionally definite.[1]

Chapter 6 discusses Quine's set theory NF, which allows precisely those instances of naive set comprehension where the comprehension formula is "stratified", in the sense of being obtained from a formula of simple type theory by deleting all the type indices. Incurvati offers a partial defense of NF against the received view, which dismisses the theory as merely an ad hoc trick, with no associated conception. He tried hard to articulate a "stratified conception of set" associated with NF. This would be an instance of the logical conception of collection, where the collections are regarded as "objectified properties". Following Nino Cocchiarella, Incurvati proposes that such objectified properties can be useful in the study of the semantic phenomenon of nominalization. Overall, the chapter is a rewarding survey of what is known about NF, both mathematically (e.g., concerning the consistency of NF and kindred systems) and historically (e.g., Quine's motivation for developing the system). The most ambitious, though slightly underdeveloped, part of the chapter is an intriguing attempt to argue that "when sets are conceived of as objectified properties, the restriction to stratified conditions in the Naive Comprehension Schema can be naturally motivated" (177). The idea is that our choice of objects to represent properties "ought to be insensitive to the particular choice of association between objects and properties" (176).

Finally, Chapter 7 discusses the graph conception, which regards sets as "simply objects having membership structure" (200). A nice way to depict this membership structure is by means of certain kinds of directed graphs, where an arrow from one node to another depicts that the set represented by the former node has as an element the set represented by the latter node. For example, an arrow from a single node to itself depicts a set a = {a}. So, on this conception, non-well-founded sets are entirely natural. It turns out we must impose some requirements on the graphs, e.g., that there is a designated point which represents the set depicted by this graph. The graph conception can now be expressed as the view "that sets are what is [sic] depicted by an arbitrary graph" (197) -- where the appropriate requirements on the graphs are left implicit. Incurvati skillfully guides us through four different non-wellfounded set theories discussed in Peter Aczel's (1988) classic, which in turn correspond to four different versions of the graph conception. He proceeds to discuss which version is the more plausible, attempting to provide "a rationale for restricting attention to" one of the systems (namely, the system based on the "anti-foundation axiom" AFA (185)). Again, I worry that Incurvati's method of "inference to the best conception" is biased against more pluralist views. Is this necessarily a race where the winner takes all? Why cannot all four versions of the graph conception be "correct"?[2]

A strange omission in Incurvati's otherwise very comprehensive survey of conceptions of set is the predicative conception of set, developed by Hermann Weyl, Solomon Feferman, and others. The idea is to revive a logical conception of collection in a less naive way. While the iterative conception requires that every set be "formed" from antecedently available objects, the predicative conception requires that every collection be "specified" by means of a membership condition that relies solely on antecedently available objects. This, too, blocks the paradoxes. Predicativity is often enforced by means of the vicious circle principle, which prohibits the membership condition of a collection from quantifying over a domain to which this collection would belong. Admittedly, on its own, the predicative conception is fairly weak. But, arguably it is mathematically richer and more fruitful than several of the other conceptions Incurvati considers. Moreover, a moderate pluralist about sets can combine the predicative conception with the iterative one to obtain a valuable supplement to ZFC (cf. Fine (2005)).

I wish to end by stressing that the handful of criticisms I have made do not change my very favorable overall assessment of the book. This is without doubt the best discussion available of the variety of conceptions of set that have been proposed. As such, the book is warmly recommended, both to researchers in the philosophy of mathematics and for teaching purposes.


Thanks to Luca Incurvati for discussions of a draft of this review.


Aczel, P. (1988). Non-Well-Founded Sets. Number 14 in CSLI Lecture Notes. CSLI Publications, Stanford.

Fine, K. (2005). Class and membership. Journal of Philosophy, 102(11):547-572.

Jané, I. and Uzquiano, G. (2004). Well- and non-well-founded Fregean extensions. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 33(5):437-465.

Linnebo, Ø. (2008). Structuralism and the Notion of Dependence. Philosophical Quarterly, 58:59-79.

Linnebo, Ø. (2018). Dummett on indefinite extensibility. Philosophical Issues, 28(1):196-220.

Maddy, P. (1990). Realism in Mathematics. Clarendon, Oxford.


[1] For the universal concept U (defined by 'x = x') to be extensionally definite, we would, by Definition 2, need to have ∀x(UxFx) ∨ ¬∀x(UxFx) for every concept F, such that ∀x(Fx ∨ ¬Fx) -- where the background logic is intuitionistic. It is easy to construct Kripke models which show that this need not be so.

[2] A pluralist answer is suggested by the following considerations. Given a graph and the information that it is a so-called "exact" picture of a set, we have unambiguously specified everything there is to know about the depicted set, namely, all the objects in its transitive closure and all the membership and identity relations that obtain among these objects (cf. 187). Furthermore, as Incurvati explains, the four versions of the graph conception correspond to stronger and stronger requirements on a graph for it to be an exact picture of a set. Thus, each version of the graph conception has its stock of exact pictures, each of which specifies everything there is to know about the depicted set.