Conceptions of Truth

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Kunne, Wolfgang, Conceptions of Truth, Oxford, 2003, 512pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199241317

Reviewed by Douglas Patterson, Kansas State University


Künne’s Conceptions of Truth comprises both an encyclopedic treatment of the current literature on truth and Künne’s defense of his own “Modest Account” of the topic. In the former respect the book is thorough, clear, and well-argued, and in many cases Künne advances the debate on various issues of detail. Topics covered include, among others, the interpretation of Frege’s notoriously difficult remarks on truth, various attempts to work out the idea that truth is a kind of correspondence, the notion of “truthmaking”, Tarski’s “semantic conception”, and the proper formulation and evaluation of disquotational and prosententialist forms of deflationism about truth with extended treatments of, e.g., the generalizing function of the truth-predicate and sentential quantification. Künne favors the view that truth is in the first instance a property of propositions, and he provides an extended treatment both of propositions in general and of questions concerning truth for them, such as whether propositions bear their truth-value eternally. He discusses at length the closest relative of his own view, Horwich’s Minimalism, and concludes the book with a consideration and rejection of what Davidson has called “epistemically constrained” conceptions of truth. Throughout Künne relates the contemporary issues to episodes in the history of the topic, with competent, though justifiably proleptic, treatments of contributions from (to name only a few) Aristotle, the Stoics, Kant, and 19th and early 20th century figures such as Bolzano, Brentano, Frege, Russell, Moore and Wittgenstein. In its scope and clarity the book should rightly become the standard text for an introductory graduate seminar on truth. Anyone new to the topic will do well to turn to it, and the expert will benefit both from Künne’s setting of the issues and from his detailed contributions.

Here I will focus on Künne’s positive view. The Modest Account, in its official formulation, reads as follows (337):

(MOD) ∀x (x is true ↔ ∃p (x=[p]& p))

The brackets take a sentence and return a term that refers to the proposition expressed by that sentence. The existential quantification is into sentential positions but is not to be read substitutionally. Hence such a quantification might be true in a language even though it has no true instances therein. This reading is intended to sidestep standard objections to substitutional quantification, such as those that concern its basic intelligibility (358), ascriptions of retained belief (359) or the intuition that there are truths inexpressible in any non-trivially defined extension of English (360).

Künne wisely doesn’t claim originality for the Modest Account: he notes anticipations of it in work by Ramsey (339ff), Tarski (341ff), Soames (365ff) and others, and, indeed, as his historical discussion makes clear, intimations of the Modest Account have been in the air at least since Aristotle’s famous “to say of what is, that it is, is true” (1011b26-27): the “modesty” of the account is intended precisely to consist in the fact that it goes no further than the intuitive idea that as “all philosophers, I dare say, would most cordially agree … what you say or think is true if and only if things are as you say or think they are” (334). (It should be noted that one recent appearance of the Modest Account that Künne neglects is in various formulations proffered in McGrath 1997, where the views are attributed to Ernest Sosa.)

Advantages of the Modest Account are supposed to include the following. First, “the internal structure of truth-value bearers is entirely left open” (317); this allows the theory not to succumb to problems that plague Tarski-inspired attempts to define truth by recursion on the structure of truth-bearers when it comes to constructions (e.g. attitude ascriptions) that resist truth-functional treatment (205ff). Second, by treating propositions rather than sentences as the bearers of truth, the theory is intended to respect the prima facie appearance that we often attribute truth to “what is said”, “what is believed” and so on, where these entities are potentially the contents of numerous intentional acts and attitudes (251ff). In doing so it likewise avoids the objections that Künne finds convincing (263ff) to treating sentences or utterances as truth-bearers. Third, the theory is supposed to have the advantage of finite statability over its close relative, Horwich’s Minimal Theory, which consists of all propositions of the form “the proposition that p is true iff p” (save those that engender paradox).

Though he is sensitive to the current interest in the literature over the difference between theories of truth that are “deflationary” and those that aren’t, Künne studiously avoids comment on which sort of view his is (19). He is hardly to be faulted for this, since views on what the difference consists in have to date arrived at something less than consensus; in this context one can appreciate an author’s wanting simply to stay above the fray (20). Be this as it may, on my own preferred understanding (see Patterson 2002) the difference comes to this: a view is deflationary if it, in conjunction with minimal additional resources such as information about the standard names of sentences, implies instances of the relevant analogue, for the truth-bearers it concerns, of the T-schema “x is true if and only if p”, where the sentence substituted for “p” shares its meaning with x, or, where x is a proposition, the proposition expressed by the sentence substituted for “p” is x. In this sense Künne’s theory is deflationary; indeed, he goes out of his way to prove that his theory implies the instances (353ff), since he accepts, following Tarski on his reading, that a theory’s doing so is a necessary condition of adequacy (183ff). (In fact, both the claim of necessity and the attribution of it to Tarski, I believe, are mistaken, but I won’t belabor this here. Those interested may see Patterson 2002 and forthcoming.) Deflationary theories tie the account of truth to the conditions under which particular truth-bearers are true; the correspondence theories Künne discusses don’t do this, while his theory, like other deflationary theories, does.

It is, of course, supposed to be the primary advantage of the Modest Account that it gives a correct and complete account of truth. Here I will raise three questions as to whether it actually enjoys this advantage, the first turning on its treatment of the relation between propositional truth and truth for sentences and utterances, the second concerning an implicit reliance on the notion of truth in the statement of the account, and the third concerning the account’s relation to the paradoxes. I don’t consider any of the considerations I will offer to be knock-down objections, but I do think that they all raise serious questions that call for further discussion.

As for the first, at some point one would want to extend the account of truth for propositions to an account of truth at least for sentences and utterances. Künne recognizes this, and writes (373):

If the concept of a proposition is explained in the way I suggested in Chapter 5.1.1, without invoking either the notion of meaning or the notion of truth, then there is room left for combining a modest account of truth with a potentially illuminating theory of expressing a truth. The latter would try to answer questions such as these: what do the components of a sentence and the mode of their composition contribute to enabling the sentence to serve as a vehicle for saying something true? Which relation obtains between knowledge of those contributions and comprehension of the meaning of those sentences? By advocating the modest account of truth, one does not incur an obligation to reject such questions as not worth asking or as being incapable of having substantial answers. One is only committed to the refusal to regard those answers as contributing to an explanation of the concept of truth. The modest account can consistently be combined with the truth-conditionalist tenet that knowing the meaning of a declarative sentence depends on knowing under what conditions this sentence expresses, with respect to a given context, a true proposition.

We can see the issue here as turning on the status of the “Bridge-Principle” (264)

(BP) s is true in L with respect to c iff what is literally said when s is used as a sentence of L in c is true.

Künne’s view is that (BP) is an explanation of sentential truth (relative to a context) in terms of a more basic notion of truth for propositions, the one spelled out in the Modest Account. In the above quotation he maintains that there could be substantial, informative accounts of the conditions under which a sentence does, as used in a certain context, express a certain proposition. The question, then, is as follows: what are the prospects for an account of what is literally said when s is used as a sentence of L in c which (a) implies that the sentence so used expresses the proposition that p but which (b) makes no explanatory appeal to sentential truth?

Künne has flagged the topic as an issue for further work, and I myself have no definitive argument that such an account cannot be provided. However, there are good reasons to think that prospects for such an account are bleak. (The next few paragraphs present a relative of the “Determination Argument” of Bar-On, Horisk and Lycan 1999.) Since Künne does allow (in the above quotation) that knowing the meaning of a sentence depends on knowing under which conditions it expresses a true proposition, presumably he would accept that the meaning of a sentence determines the conditions under which it expresses a true proposition (relative to a context), otherwise it would be a mystery why the even stronger claim that knowledge of meaning requires knowledge of truth conditions of truth held good. The account of what it is for a sentence (used as a sentence of L in context c—henceforth I will elide the qualification for brevity) to express a proposition may therefore be represented as associating with the sentence some complex property M (e.g. an inferential or cognitive role, a communal use, a set of causal relations of its tokenings with worldly items, etc.) such that a sentence that has M will express the proposition that p, and hence will express a proposition that is true iff p. However, all the most obvious ways of doing so are unavailable to Künne. At least some of Künne’s own criticisms of disquotationalism about truth (228ff) can easily be modified to undermine a disqutotational account of expressing a proposition (“p” expresses the proposition that p). It in turn would clearly not do to maintain that a sentence expresses the proposition that p if and only if it is true if and only if p (and perhaps meets further conditions), since this would require some independent account of truth for sentences and thereby allow us to read (BP) in the opposite of Künne’s preferred direction, thus rendering the modest theory otiose.

Hence, somehow, the account of the expression of propositions by sentences must associate with each sentence of a language some property M such that a sentence’s having M is sufficient to determine that the sentence expresses a proposition that is true iff p, for some substituend for “p”, and thereby sufficient to determine that the sentence itself is true if and only if p. Yet that M determines such truth-conditions must be no part of the account of M itself. Furthermore, M’s determination of such truth-conditions, it is to be remembered, must be modally robust: in any world where the language in question is as it actually is, M must determine these conditions of truth. (It isn’t just in the actual world that the meaning of “Schnee ist weiss” determines that it expresses the proposition that snow is white.) The account of meaning and proposition expression, therefore, must somehow associate with each sentence a property M such that necessarily (holding the language fixed) to have M is to be true iff p for some substituend for “p”, all the while being “blind” to the fact that the condition that p is the truth-condition of the sentence. The result would be an odd kind of modally robust coincidence: it just so turns out that M determines these conditions of truth in all worlds where the language is held fixed, even though M itself is not explained or defined in terms of these conditions. It is reasonable to suspect here that any actual attempt at securing this kind of modal tie between meaning and truth-conditions will at some point tacitly invoke truth-conditions in the explanation of meaning. Perhaps this will turn out not to be the case, but the topic deserves further discussion, since extending the notion of truth to sentences and utterances is not merely a side issue for a theory that takes propositions to be the primary bearers of truth.

My second criticism concerns whether Künne is able to tell us the whole truth about truth, even for propositions. My contention will be that the account most likely tacitly relies on some more fundamental conception of truth for propositions. Remember that Künne accepts (a propositional analogue of) Convention T as applied to his account: whether it is good or not turns crucially on whether it implies an instance of the “Denominalization Schema”

(DS) [p] is true iff p

for each proposition. It is an assumption of this view that the instances of this schema are good things for an account of truth for propositions to be committed to. Of course, the assumption seems impeccable: surely the instances are true (ignoring for now problems about the paradoxes), and they seem to many to capture something or even everything important about truth for propositions.

However, there is more to nominalization and denominalization than meets the eye. Consider another nominalizing operator “/…/” which takes a sentence and returns a name of the negation of the proposition it expresses. The operator is just as well defined as Künne’s. Would the following relative of Künne’s (MOD), however, be a good theory of truth for propositions?

(MOD-) ∀x (x is true ↔ ∃p (x=/p/& p))

Of course not. This theory implies instances of “/p/ is true iff p”, each of which is equivalent to an instance of “[~p] is true iff p”. (Ignore for the sake of argument that (MOD-) is also defective in that it doesn’t apply to propositions without an “outermost” negation. Clearly a more complicated story about a “/…/”-like nominalizer could be told that would make the same point—consider a system of Gödel numbering for propositions and various permutations defined thereupon.) Lurking behind the apparent simplicity of Künne’s nominalization operator, then, is a very substantial issue: which instances of

x is true iff p

where “x” ranges over propositions are the ones a good theory of truth for propositions should imply? Not all sets of such instances contain only acceptable consequences of an account of truth for propositions. A full defense of a theory of truth of Künne’s sort, then, requires properly implied sets of such instances to be identified on some principle. But what could the principle be? The obvious one is that the theory should imply instances of “x is true iff p” such that x is, in fact, true iff p. But if this is how the story goes, then Künne’s theory tells us what truth is for propositions only by assuming that we already know what it is for a proposition to be true, and furthermore, that we already know under what conditions each proposition is true. If this isn’t how the story goes, then we need a much more involved account of how the instances are to be identified.

Suppose Künne goes the first route. He might account this a further virtuous modesty in the theory: it simply expresses succinctly something that we must already know in order to recognize its correctness. Our lesson, though, would then be that the theory simply doesn’t do something that we might have expected it to do: it isn’t sufficient to convey an understanding of what it is for a proposition to be true to someone who antecedently lacks such an understanding. One might get the impression that doing so is Künne’s aim from passages like (337) quoted above: relying only on our understanding of the objects of attitudes and acts such as believing and saying, the theory introduces the notion of truth, as if for the first time. If the above argument is correct, this can’t be how it goes. If Künne would go the second route, by contrast, a substantial part of the Modest Account has yet to be formulated, and we can rightly wonder whether it could be.

Finally, let us enter a word on the paradoxes. Künne, like many authors on the topic, proposes to set aside questions about them in the belief that the theory of truth can to some extent successfully be studied in abstraction from them (vii). As Künne recognizes, however, his Modest Account as it stands simply implies contradictions: “The semantic antinomies are a menace to all formulations of the modest account as well as to any other attempt at explaining the notion of truth: if you substitute a ’Liar’ sentence, you can quickly derive a contradiction” (350). I explain in §6 of Patterson forthcoming why I disagree with the “as well any other attempt”; the issues are related to my parenthetical remarks above about Convention T. Here we can abstract from the issue, since as the passage that follows indicates, the problem concerns truth-ascriptions, and not necessarily the theory of truth itself. He writes (350):

Perhaps one should rather turn the tables. If truth-ascriptions sometimes risk being paradoxical, then no account of the workaday concept expressed by the truth-predicate would be faithful that did not share this feature: it would be objectionable if the explanans of ’true’ were protected against the risk of occasionally exhibiting paradoxical features. After all, the aim was not that of finding a better-behaved substitute for the natural language predicate ’is true’.

Some may interpret this as Künne simply throwing up his hands, but I think the remarks are insightful and hold on to one of the most important facts in the theory of truth in a way that many remarks on the topic do not. The question they raise, however, is this: how are we to reconcile the paradox-engendering features of truth-ascriptions with the demand, surely not gratuitous, that serious theories not imply contradictions? Our choice appears to be either to be unfaithful to the actual meaning of a truth-ascription, or to be unfaithful to the claim that a sentence and its negation cannot both be true, and hence that no theory that implies both can be. It is to Künne’s credit that he refuses an easy way out of this fundamental dilemma. (Though I am not myself a dialethist, I do find Priest’s writings on the topic, e.g. in the early chapters of Priest 1987, to be among the most insightful there are.) Again, though, as Künne would be the first to admit, an important front in the defense of the Modest Account has as yet been left unsecured.

The above are all fundamental issues in the account of truth, and it is no chagrin to Künne that even in a long book he has not settled them once and for all. I have myself benefited from Künne’s study, and I trust that the reader of this review will do so as well. I recommend Conceptions of Truth most highly.


Bar-On, Dorit, Horisk, Claire, and Lycan, William 1999: “Deflationism, Meaning and Truth-Conditions”, Philosophical Studies 101, 1-28.

McGrath, Matthew 1997: “Weak Deflationism”, Mind 106, 69-98.

Patterson, Douglas 2002: “Theories of Truth and Convention T”, Philosophers’ Imprint 2:5.

Patterson, Douglas forthcoming: “Tarski on the Necessity Reading of Convention T”, Synthese.

Priest, Graham 1987: In Contradiction: A Study of the Transconsistent (Dordrecht, Martinus Nijhoff)