Concepts and Their Role in Knowledge: Reflections on Objectivist Epistemology

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Allan Gotthelf and James G. Lennox (eds.), Concepts and Their Role in Knowledge: Reflections on Objectivist Epistemology, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2013, 298pp. $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780822944249.

Reviewed by Stephen R. C. Hicks, Rockford University


The most important issue in modern philosophy is the relationship between consciousness and reality. Allan Gotthelf and James Lennox have collected a highly-competent set of essays arguing the strengths and weaknesses of Objectivist epistemology. The fourteen essays were originally presented as papers at Ayn Rand Society meetings at the American Philosophical Association and, after revision, prepared for this volume. The format is that of formalized scholarly debate, with initial essays presented by four Objectivist scholars. Those essays are critiqued by philosophers from a variety of other perspectives, and the Objectivists then reply. The result is is impressive both for the depth of discussion of fundamental issues and for the civility and engaged seriousness of focus on the issues, despite often sharp disagreements.

Thematically, the essays raise essential issues about consciousness's relation to reality: Is perception direct? How are abstract concepts derived from concrete percepts? How does perception confer justification upon conceptual formulations? What is a definition? Do concepts and/or definitions pick out natural kinds? Do concepts change with advances in science? All of the essays are by specialists in Objectivism, epistemology, and/or philosophy of science, so the result collectively is an engaging and informative give-and-take discussion of Rand's contribution to the debates.

The volume's two editors, Gotthelf and Lennox, also have a deserved strong reputation for scholarship on Aristotle's philosophy, especially his biologically-informed philosophy of science, and that brings a historically contextualizing dimension to the collection. Across history, theories of concepts tend to fall into three categories. One extreme -- strong realism -- holds that abstract concepts pick out real abstract essences in the world. The other extreme -- strong nominalism -- holds that concepts themselves are particulars that are merely subjective labels attached to sets of similar particular things in the world. A third position -- conceptualism -- holds that concepts are abstractions derived from particulars in the world.

Epistemologically, the two extremes of realism and nominalism have jointly posed a dilemma for knowledge-seekers. If, on the one hand, concepts are only subjective groupings based on rough similarities, then it is hard to see how conceptual principles can identify absolute and precise cause-and-effect relationships that actually exist in the world. Such nominalism tends to skepticism about the objectivity of knowledge. But if, on the other hand, there are supposedly real abstract essences out there in the world and our conceptual principles grasp them, then it is hard to identify a cognitive faculty that picks them out without resorting to some kind of rationalistic intuitionism. Such realism tends to mysticism.

Common to both realism and nominalism is a mimetic view of concepts. The realists argue that, to be valid, abstract concepts must mirror actual abstractions in the world, so our abstract knowledge must be derived via some abstraction-mimetic cognitive capacity. The nominalists deny that abstractions exist in reality and they deny that we have any such abstraction-mimetic cognitive capacity, so they conclude that we what we call knowledge of the world cannot be abstract. The conceptualists have expressed dissatisfaction with both realism and nominalism and have sought to avoid the problems of each while developing an account of concepts that captures both the particularity of reality and the abstractness of our conceptual awareness of it. Yet no account to date has commanded widespread assent.

Historically, strong realism is associated with the broadly Platonic tradition, strong nominalism with the Sophistic tradition, and conceptualism with the Aristotelian tradition. Rand's view is that concepts have a non-subjective basis in particulars but result from an active conscious process of abstracting; that makes her roughly Aristotelian, but with a twist. In her formulation, essences are epistemological and not metaphysical: they are formed by a conscious process of "measurement-omission," but they have an ontological basis in facts about particulars. A key quotation from Rand's Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology is given on page 125 of Gotthelf and Lennox's volume:

Objectivism holds that the essence of a concept is that fundamental characteristic(s) of its units on which the greatest number of other characteristics depend, and which distinguishes these units from all other existents within the field of man's knowledge. Thus the essence of a concept is determined contextually and may be altered with the growth of man's knowledge. The metaphysical referent of man's concepts is not a special, separate metaphysical essence, but the total of the facts of reality [about their referents] he has observed, and this total determines which characteristics of group of existents he designates as essential. An essential characteristic is factual, in the sense that it does exist, does determine other characteristics and does distinguish a group of existents from all others; it is epistemological in the sense that the classification of "essential characteristic" is a device of man's method of cognition -- a means of classifying, condensing and integrating an ever-growing body of knowledge.

The volume begins with four core essays by Gotthelf, Gregory Salmieri, Onkar Ghate, and Lennox, each focusing primarily on a different aspect of Rand's theory of concepts and its implications for other epistemological issues.

Gotthelf presents an overview of the Objectivist theory of concepts. He outlines the process of concept-formation from the perceptual observation of similarities and differences, the identification of a Conceptual Common Denominator, the omission of measurement, and the construction of a definition. Gotthelf stresses that Rand's is a non-Lockean account of abstraction: a concept's universality is a feature, not of the object of awareness but of the form in which one is conceptually aware of the particular object. Rand's account presupposes the existence of a preconceptual perceptual given and the capacity to form perceptual judgments. Conceptualization is also a process that builds upon itself, so Gotthelf sketches the process of forming abstractions from abstractions, with its implications for the ensuing hierarchical structure of conceptual knowledge. Conceptualization, on Rand's account, is also a volitional and not automatic process, so Gotthelf discusses the human need for normative principles of cognition such as Rand's variation on Ockham's Razor -- Do not multiply concepts beyond necessity -- and on objectivity.

Salmieri's wide-ranging essay expands upon Gotthelf's by discussing Rand's theory of concepts in the context of its place among a broad slate of epistemic issues. Given that humans are neither infallible nor omniscient, epistemic justification is a human need, so Salmieri connects Rand's theory to contemporary foundationalism-versus-coherentism and internalism-versus-externalism debates. Given that consciousness is dependently relational, objectivity requires a fundamental respect for the "Primacy of Existence." Awareness of existence, according to Objectivism, is first perceptual, so Salmieri defends Rand's point that perception is infallible against the standard challenges of perceptual illusions and hallucinations. Any particular concept is (or should be) integrated into a network of other concepts, so Salmieri sketches the implication of the Objectivist theory of concepts for propositions and the process of induction. On induction, Salmieri refers us to Leonard Peikoff's and David Harriman's recent work extending Objectivist epistemology to include an account of induction. Finally, Salmieri discusses briefly Rand's principle of contextual certainty and her analysis of several epistemic errors such as floating abstractions, stolen concepts, and package deals.

Ghate's essay is less exegetical of Rand and more narrowly focused on issues of perception. Drawing upon Rand and David Kelley's Objectivist-influenced theory of perception, Ghate discusses a wide range of perception issues. Rand's is a direct realist or presentational theory: perception is a relational phenomenon; it is a form of awareness of external objects. Thus Rand's theory rejects representational theories that hold that a percept is an object of awareness. So Ghate takes up the presentational-versus-representational debates. He takes William Alston's theory as his foil, distinguishes naïve realist versions of presentationalism from more sophisticated accounts, and argues that direct realism can handle the challenges of perceptual relativity, illusions, hallucinations, and errors of judgment.

Lennox discusses the Objectivist theory of concepts and its implications for philosophy of science, especially the issue of conceptual change and the growth of knowledge. Concepts are flexible: they are, according to Rand, open-ended, and their definitions are contextual and subject to change as knowledge grows. Yet concepts also retain their identity over time despite those changes. How is this possible? Lennox offers a taxonomy of five types of conceptual change -- the introduction of a new concept, the development of sub-classifications, the development of wider concepts to subsume narrower concepts, the rejection of problematic concepts, and the reclassification of concepts -- and uses as illustrations several extended examples from the history of biology, most notably the decades-long debate by Georges Cuvier, Jean-Baptiste Lamarck, John Vaughan Thompson, and Charles Darwin over how to classify Cirripedia (barnacles).

After the four core essays, the subsequent essays are a back-and-forth discussion in greater detail of specific epistemological issues connected to concepts.

Paul E. Griffiths, responding to Ghate, takes up the issue of natural kinds. He argues that Rand anticipates in some ways the current state of the mainstream discussion of natural kinds, but he is not convinced that her theory is yet robust enough to handle all of the challenges that can be leveled against the natural kinds tradition.

Jim Bogen, responding to Gotthelf, addresses several issues about definitions, challenging Rand's account on the grounds that definitions are not unitary in type, giving examples from epidemiology and neuroscience to illustrate his contention that definitions serve different sorts of cognitive purposes.

Richard Burian responds to Lennox's Objectivist account of conceptual change. He finds substantial agreement between their views, but disagrees with Lennox over whether first-order scientific concepts can be retained or whether they must be replaced when systematically altered. To illustrate, he provides an extended example about the concept of the atom in the history of chemistry.

Pierre Le Morvan takes up the direct realist accounts of perception given by Salmieri and Ghate. He first defends William Alston's theory of appearing against Ghate's criticisms, and then he defends a fallibilist account of perception in contrast to Rand's infallibilist account as argued by Salmieri. Of special interest here is whether the Müller-Lyer illusion can be explained in terms of conceptual misinterpretation of the percept.

Bill Brewer argues from a position of agreement with Rand that direct realism is true, but he argues that Rand's view as presented by Salmieri ultimately turns out to be a kind of representationalism or indirect realism. Of special interest here is his discussion of Objectivism's hypothetical example of a Martian's experience of the musical note middle C. Suppose that the Martian experienced colors the way we humans experience music -- e.g., that when a green object passed before the Martian's eyes its experience was like the experience we have when hearing middle C played on a piano.

And in the volume's concluding essay, epistemologist Benjamin Bayer takes up the debate between Le Morvan and Brewer on the one side and Salmieri and Ghate on the other. His contribution is to further extend the discussion over whether fallibilism best captures the data about perceptual illusions or whether infallibilism has the resources to explain them (he thinks it does), and to explain the Martian's experience of middle C in a way that does not collapse an apparently direct realist theory into representationalism.

In my judgment, three things emerge from this volume. One is the sophistication of Rand's new hypothesis and the range of epistemological puzzles it has the potential to address fruitfully. Second is the relationship of Rand's epistemology to the theories of knowledge of Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Locke, Hume, and Kant -- the luminaries whose positions define the landscape of philosophical possibility. And third is the integration Rand's views into the philosophical discussion over the last two generations about concepts (W.V.O. Quine, Peter Geach, John McDowell, Colin McGinn), percepts (Roderick Chisholm, Wilfrid Sellars, Donald Davidson, William Alston, James Pryor), and the nature of scientific theories (N.R. Hanson, Stephen Toulmin, Thomas Kuhn, Paul Feyerabend, Ian Hacking). Certainly this volume is important to the development of Objectivist epistemology, but it is also important to the development of epistemology proper.