Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism

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David Braddon-Mitchell and Robert Nola (eds.), Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism, MIT Press, 2009, 370pp., $38.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262512282.

Reviewed by Jussi Haukioja, University of Turku



The papers collected in this volume are all concerned with aspects of the general program of philosophical methodology that has come to be known as the “Canberra plan”. On this view, one central task of philosophy (which will here be called the first stage of the Canberra Plan) consists in the a priori analysis of our philosophically interesting everyday concepts and folk theories. (Often this task is pictured as a project of collecting and systematizing “folk platitudes” about the concepts or areas of discourse in question.) The completion of this task paves the way for another task (the second stage), that of locating the referents of these concepts in the account of fundamental reality given to us by our best scientific theories. The first stage provides us with Ramsey sentences that specify what kinds of entities the world would have to contain in order for our folk theories and concepts to have realizers and referents; in the second stage we consult the best scientific (typically, physical) theories to see whether such referents are to be found in reality. If they are, we can identify the referents of our terms with these properties, definable in terms of our best scientific theory, and thus vindicate our application of the concepts in question. The central figures of the Canberra Plan have been David Lewis and Frank Jackson, and it has been put to work by a number of other people (many of them somehow associated with the Philosophy Program of the Research School of Social Sciences in Canberra) in theories of various philosophically relevant areas, most prominently in the philosophy of mind and in ethics.

The volume begins with a helpful introduction from the editors, in which they give a detailed and particularly clear overview of the Canberra Plan. The following 13 chapters are divided, somewhat unevenly, into three parts, with Part I (Mind, Concept and Theories) including seven essays, Part II (Metaphysics) four essays, and Part III (Normativity) only two.

Two chapters stand out from the table of contents. Given the central role that David Lewis has played in the Canberra Plan, it is fitting that the collection contains a paper by him. Nevertheless two things make Lewis’s “Ramseyan Humility”, which opens Part II of the volume, quite special: the paper is previously unpublished, and, despite this, it has already provoked published responses. Another item that is bound to create interest is the long chapter containing a correspondence between Frank Jackson — the other central figure associated with the Canberra Plan — and Steven Stich and Kelby Mason.

In “Ramseyan Humility” Lewis argues, using the machinery associated with the Canberra Plan, that even if we were to arrive at a ‘final’ theory of the universe, there would still remain a sense in which we would be left in ignorance of the fundamental properties of reality. Lewis’s argument is in two stages: first, a permutation argument shows how the Ramsey sentence we get from the final theory would always have multiple possible realizers, and second, an epistemological argument shows that, since the different possible realizers would be empirically indistinguishable, we can never know the identity of the actual realizers.

As noted above, “Ramseyan Humility”, although previously unpublished, has already provoked discussion. In the volume, Lewis’s essay is accompanied by an enthusiastic paper by Dustin Locke, defending Lewis against his critics. Locke lays out Lewis’s argument with admirable clarity and goes on to argue that, contrary to what his critics have claimed, the argument does not implicitly rely on an implausibly strict conception of knowledge. Finally, Locke agrees with Lewis that the conclusion of the argument is far from unpalatable — humility does not claim that we are ignorant of something which we would ordinarily assume ourselves to know.

The correspondence between Frank Jackson (who has also contributed an article to the volume) and Steven Stich and Kelby Mason spans over 50 pages, in 12 letters sent over a period of almost two years. The format is exciting, and the participants appear initially to be quite enthusiastic about the exchange. In the letters, Jackson as well as Stich and Mason start out by trying to clarify and understand their disagreements about the status of folk psychology and the philosophical relevance of putative cross-cultural variation in intuitions concerning philosophically central concepts. From there, the discussion moves on to the notions of a theory and a pattern and the distinction between personal and sub-personal levels, among other things. Along the way, many points are clarified but unfortunately, after a few exchanges, things seem to come to a disappointing standstill, where the two parties agree that they are talking at cross purposes, with no resolution in sight. It is just as easy to share their frustration at the conclusion as it was to share their excitement in the beginning. Nonetheless, I think the format employed here could in many cases be a fruitful one, and could be employed far more, especially in collections of essays such as this one.

The rest of the chapters form a fairly well balanced selection of critical evaluations, defenses and elaborations of the Canberra Plan, its methodology, commitments, and applications. The first paper of Part I, by David Braddon-Mitchell, is an ambitious attempt to map out the space of possible moves that the Canberra Planner might make in response to two kinds of challenges: the need for an extension of two-dimensional semantics that would be able to handle hyperintensionality, and the question of how we could hope to find out the contents of our concepts a priori, if our conceptual dispositions are taken to determine these contents — are not our armchair judgments about such dispositions empirically defeasible? Braddon-Mitchell does not pretend to give any final answers to such questions, but rather sketches — in quite an illuminating fashion — the way these complicated issues might possibly be resolvable.

The papers by Frank Jackson and Daniel Stoljar are concerned with the application of the Canberra Plan in physicalist theories of mental states. Jackson’s "A Priori Biconditionals and Metaphysics" explores the use, utility, and epistemic status of psychophysical identifications. Stoljar, in his “The Argument from Revelation”, criticizes Lewis’s argument for the conclusion that the physicalist needs to formulate a replacement notion of experience. Lewis claimed that we need such a notion because our ordinary conception of experience incorporates the thesis of “Revelation”: the view that merely having an experience puts you in a position to know the nature of the experience. Stoljar argues compellingly against various reasons that have been given for the thesis, and thereby against the very need for a replacement conception of experience.

The next two papers, by Fred Kroon and by Justine Kingsbury and Jonathan McKeown-Green, are concerned with the Canberra Planners’ — in particular, Jackson’s — commitment to descriptivism, and thereby to the availability of armchair analyses. While both papers contain some critical remarks, they also offer friendly amendments to Jackson’s views to deal with the problems they bring up. The final paper in Part I, by Peter Menzies and Huw Price, is rather different in its aims. They note that the analyses which we discover at the first stage of the Canberra Plan will, it seems, have to include semantic notions. This raises the problem: what about the semantic notions themselves? Menzies and Price argue that the Planners face an unpleasant choice: they will either have to accept that semantic notions are not within the reach of the general program, or they will have to abandon the second stage of the Plan.

The second part of the volume, on metaphysics, contains two essays in addition to the papers by Lewis and Locke. In his intriguing “Physicalism without Pop-out”, Philip Pettit tries to find an explanation for certain anti-physical intuitions, compatible with the Canberra Plan view that the psychological (as well as intentional, social, and so on) truths are a priori derivable from the physical truths that hold of our world. According to Pettit, we suffer from a derivational deficiency that inhibits “inferential pop-out”, the experience of seeing how and why the physical reality necessitates the psychological truths. In “Platitudes and Metaphysics”, Daniel Nolan asks whether the Canberra Plan has any application to fundamental metaphysics. At first sight it might seem that it cannot, since the second stage of the Plan always takes place against a background of a scientific ontology, and thus presupposes an inventory of the things which exist. However, Nolan finds three ways in which platitudes analysis might still be helpful in fundamental metaphysics.

The third part, “Normativity”, contains only two papers. In “Naturalizing Normativity”, Mark Colyvan aims to provide a non-circular naturalistic account of the normativity of theories of rationality. In the final essay of the collection, Denis Robinson promotes a view he calls “ethical quasi-relativism”, which arises as a consequence of taking into account various problems that are seen to arise for the moral functionalism promoted by Jackson and Pettit.