Concern, Respect, and Cooperation

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Garrett Cullity, Concern, Respect, and Cooperation, Oxford University Press, 2018, 311pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198807841.

Reviewed by Thomas Hurka, University of Toronto


This book gives a comprehensive account of morality, both its deontic part, about what we ought or have reason to do, and its evaluative part, about what's desirable or good, and it does so in the general style of W.D. Ross. Garrett Cullity doesn't give verdicts on particular acts or outcomes, nor state principles that can yield them directly. Instead he identifies a number of moral factors that, like Ross's prima facie duties, can contribute to such verdicts, and he describes the mechanisms by which they do so. His too, then, is a version of moral pluralism. But he departs from Ross in two directions. He gives further foundations for some of Ross's basic factors, which makes for more underlying unity, while also adding to the ways they generate derivative factors, so the resulting substantive view is more complex: he builds a more ramified structure on a narrower basis. His book is an original and impressive contribution to moral theory.

Whereas Ross used two fundamental concepts ("ought" or "duty" governed by a strict "ought implies can" principle, and "good" subject to no such principle), Cullity proposes a single underlying concept of "fitness." Fitness can yield judgements about reasons and about oughts when an act that's fitting whether or not you can do it becomes one you can. In addition, fitness is linked to judgements about value, since whenever something is good a positive response to it is fitting. And whereas Ross gave mere lists of duties and goods, Cullity rests all morality on three foundations: other people's welfare, which calls for concern; their self-expression (close to their autonomy), which calls for respect; and cooperation, which can call for participation. Here too his view is less pluralistic than Ross's.

But it's also more complex. Cullity says Ross's only mechanism for generating a derivative factor from a more basic one was subsumption, where the first is an instance of the second. He adds several others, which he applies at more points in the longer derivations his conceptual structure allows. Ross was also a generalist, holding that if a prima facie duty has a certain weight in one context it has the same weight in all others. Cullity holds that factors can be affected and in particular undermined by their interaction with others, so what has weight in one form or context has no weight in another. (For this reason his ultimate foundational factor is "presumptive fitness," or "fitness unless undermined." But presumptive fitness is defined in terms of fitness simpliciter, so the latter is conceptually basic.) The route from factor to final judgement is less simple than Ross imagined.

These various claims are all carefully defended and philosophically stimulating. In what follows I raise some questions about them from a more Rossian point of view, if only to bring out what's distinctive in them.

That fitness is the one basic ethical concept has recently been argued by several writers begining with A.C. Ewing.1 But do we really have an independent grasp of this concept? To play the roles Cullity assigns it, fitness can't be governed by an "ought implies can" principle and is in that respect like "good." But it shares some of the deontic flavour of "ought," since it involves a "call for" certain responses that he thinks is missing in Ross's "good." Can we really understand it, except as intermediate between the other two? "Fitness" isn't as common in everyday moral thought as "ought" and "good," and to me it's an open question whether it has the independence needed to be a foundational concept. At the same time, it's unclear how much else in Cullity's view would be lost if it isn't a foundational conept. Instead of saying an act is fitting, for example, he could say it's one there would be a reason to do if certain conditions were satisfied.

Cullity's three substantive foundations, in fitting responses to welfare, self-expression, and cooperation, reflect the three main ways he thinks we can relate valuably to others. But they leave several potential moral factors out.

Cullity's conception of welfare is less restrictive than some, and includes all desirable states of individuals. But he takes only other persons' welfare to be morally relevant, on the ground that morality concerns only our responses to others. Ross vehemently disagreed and affirmed duties to promote one's own knowledge and virtue. If those are important duties, what turns on denying that they're "moral"? Cullity's understanding of welfare and thus of what's to be promoted also excludes states that involve a pattern across individuals, such as equality in the distribution of happiness or the proportioning of happiness to virtue, as in comparative desert; Ross valued the latter of these and affirmed a duty to promote it. Cullity considers a fourth potential foundation, in things that are precious, and leaves it undecided whether what it grounds is "moral." But his prime illustrations of the precious are artworks and features of the environment, which the term fits better than it does distribution by desert. And is there any reason to deny that a duty to treat others as they deserve is "moral"? He may reject desert-based and other patterned goods on substantive grounds, but the issue they raise isn't one he explicitly addresses.

Cullity also thinks the different foundations call for different kinds of response. Thus others' welfare calls only for positive responses like promoting and protecting, while their self-expression calls only for negative ones, most centrally non-interference. But why can't there be independent and stronger negative reasons concerning others' welfare, for example not to cause them pain? Ross thought there are. His duty of non-maleficence had the same subject-matter as beneficence, namely goods and evils in others' lives such as their pleasure and pain, and involved a stronger demand not to directly cause the evils or destroy the goods than there is to prevent the evils and promote the goods. Cullity may say causing another pain is objectionable only when it's not consented to, so the wrong is really against self-expression. But may it not be worse to harm another without her consent than to force benefits on her without her consent? And what of beings who can't consent, like infants or animals? May it not be wrong to directly cause one of them pain in order to prevent slightly more pain to another?

A parallel issue arises about self-expression. Cullity says we have no positive reason to promote others' self-expressive projects if those are pointless, only the negative reason not to interfere. But may we not have some reason to protect others' valueless projects from wrongful interference by others? And isn't there a positive reason to enable others to self-express, for example to ensure that our children grow up with a sufficient range of options and the ability to choose rationally among them? Cullity recognizes this last reason but subsumes it under concern for their welfare, which he takes to include their freedom or autonomy. But now his division between the foundations is looking arbitrary. And the more general question is why he doesn't recognize, for each foundation, both a weaker positive reason to promote and a stronger negative one not to destroy. This would fit the patterned goods if it's wrong to treat one person in a way he doesn't deserve in order to prevent two other people from doing the same. It would also fit his third foundation if there's a stronger reason not to actively disrupt worthwhile cooperative activities in one's community than there is a positive reason to join them. Again, adopting this dual view would leave much else in his view intact.

A prominent part of Cullity's view is his account of undermining, where a more basic factor is blocked from generating, a derivative one. He takes this to have two forms. In what he calls "content-undermining," a state that presumptively makes one response fitting may not actually do so if it's oriented to something that calls for the opposite response. Thus pleasure is presumptively good and presumptively calls for promotion. But if it's malicious pleasure in another's pain, where pain calls for the opposite response of prevention, its presumptive goodness is cancelled and the pleasure is purely bad. He attributes this undermining view of malicious pleasure (mistakenly, I think) to Aristotle and Ross, and contrasts it with a "mainstream" view on which such pleasure, though bad as malicious and even bad on balance, is still to some degree good as pleasure and calls for some positive response. Since the mainstream view makes the generalist assumption that pleasantness always has the same significance, to reject it is to reject, in this context, generalism.

Many will find Cullity's view of malicious pleasure intuitive. He gives it the fullest defence I know of; he also effectively answers an argument I've made against it.2 But he underestimates some complications the view involves.

It's central to this view to deny that malicious pleasure has two relevant properties that call for two conflicting responses, but that seems the right thing to say about the related state of compassionate pain at another's pain. While good as compassionate, it seems bad as pain. This is why we sometimes don't tell our friends our troubles, but rather spare them the pain of sympathizing with us. Why the different treatment of the two feelings? Cullity holds that there's content-undermining only when an emotion is wrongly oriented to its object, as compassionate pain isn't. He cites the further case of envious pain at another's pleasure, saying its painfulness gives us no reason not to promote the pleasure.

That seems right, but if someone's envious pains mean he's often miserable, may we not, while repelled by his envy qua envy, also regret how it makes him feel? It would seem callous not to. And the point about reasons isn't limited to wrongly oriented responses. Just as the fact that a pleasure will be the object of envy is no reason not to promote the pleasure, so the fact that a pain will be the object of compassion is no reason to produce the pain. If you must produce either a milder pain for A that won't be the object of any compassion or a slightly worse one for B that will, you have no reason, not even an outweighed one, to produce the pain for B. Cullity recognizes that defenders of the mainstream view may argue that it's simpler than his because it always gives pleasantness the same significance. In response he says his view is simpler because it doesn't call for conflicting responses to the same object. But sometimes conflicting responses are appropriate, including to wrongly oriented emotions like envy. It may be that the true view here just is, as he also says, complex; but his gives malicious pleasure an anomalous treatment it would at least be good to explain.

The second form of undermining, "context-undermining," occurs in the next stage of his derivations, the transition from fitness to reasons. Even when a response is fitting and other conditions such as your ability to give it are satisfied, further facts about the situation can stop a reason from being generated. In an example that illustrates one way this can happen, you're a trustee for A's funds, and though using them to benefit your relatives might be in Cullity's sense fitting, your fiduciary relationship to A means you have no normative reason to do that; when you act as trustee the only reasons relevant to you concern A's financial interests. A perhaps more familiar view says the contrary reason still exists in cases like this and just is excluded from deliberation, but Cullity argues that his undermining view gives better verdicts in certain complex cases. And this view is available if the fittingness-claim that the relatives' interests are promotion-worthy is distinguished from the stronger claim that there's a normative reason to promote them.

After extending his view with an account of moral virtue and explaining how its foundations generate agent-relative reasons, Cullity argues that its ultimate justification is the value of the three relationships to others it guides us toward, of concern, respect, and cooperation (a further element of underlying unity). His final chapters illustrate the view by applying it to three more specific issues where its foundations seem to point in different directions: paternalism, using one person as a means to benefit another, and consumer behaviour, (including boycotts). Cullity'x general theme is that the view's additional elements, such as the two forms of undermining, allow it to give better accounts of these issues than one that simply weighs competing factors against each other. Without reaching final verdicts, it gets closer to them than Ross could.

These last chapters sometimes emphasize features of the view that readers may have missed when they were first introduced and that they may now question. For example, Cullity argues that paternalism involves context-undermining, so any reason to promote another's welfare is blocked if that would involve interference, but the ground of the undermining is facts about people in general rather than about her in particular. Still, the general thrust of the book's later parts is surely correct. A plausible moral pluralism can't just assign fixed weights to moral factors and then add them. It must recognize interaction effects among the factors that can give them different weights in different forms and, especially, different contexts. The full development of such a view requires describing these interaction effects and the more complex structure they give rise to. Even if one doesn't accept all the details of Cullity's view, it represents one articulated and attractive way of doing so.

Cullity's book covers a wide range of topics, from conceptual ones about fitness through ones about moral structure to applied ethics. It's clearly written throughout but also densely argued; it requires, though it repays, careful reading. Cullity often has his own terminology for topics that have been discussed in other language before, so readers used to that language may have to do some translation; even when his terms are more illuminating, it takes time to confirm that. A minor annoyance is a large number of endnotes, often over fifty in a chapter, that aren't especially worth looking up; readers will do best to ignore them. They're a minor blot on a stimulating and substantial contribution.

1 A.C. Ewing, The Definition of Good (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1947), pp. 169-70.

2. Thomas Hurka, Virtue, Vice, and Value (New York: Oxford University Press, 2001), pp. 147-49.