Concluding Unscientific Postscript to the Philosophical Crumbs

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Søren Kierkegaard, Concluding Unscientific Postscript to the Philosophical Crumbs, Alastair Hannay (ed., tr.), Cambridge UP, 2009, 539pp., $39.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521709101.

Reviewed by David D. Possen, Yale University



There have so far been three discernible phases — three stages, appropriately enough — in the enterprise of translating Kierkegaard into English. The first began during the Great Depression, and was something of a religious stage. Its spearhead was Walter Lowrie, an Episcopal minister who cast himself as Kierkegaard’s “missionary”, and promoted Kierkegaard’s vision of faith as a bulwark against liberal theology.1 The translations of Lowrie and his cohort are marked by a lyrical and solemn enthusiasm, which is often sustained by deft tinkering with the text.

A second stage, which it is tempting to call “ethical”, was launched in the 1970s by Howard and Edna Hong of St. Olaf College. Its fruit is Kierkegaard’s Writings, the comprehensively annotated Princeton edition of Kierkegaard’s complete works. The Hongs prized consistency and literal precision, if at times at the expense of English flow. Their books remain indispensable tools for the scholar.

This leaves the third and ongoing stage of Kierkegaard translation, which I cannot resist calling “aesthetic”.2 Its main engine is Alastair Hannay, a Scottish-born philosopher recently retired from the University of Oslo. Hannay’s offerings are deservedly popular: they are not only highly accurate, but also packaged dextrously for a wide readership. Until now, Hannay’s translations — Fear and Trembling (1985), The Sickness Unto Death (1989), an abridged Either/Or (1992), selections from Kierkegaard’s Papers and Journals (1996), and A Literary Review (2001) — were carried by Penguin. The translation here under review is Hannay’s latest, the Concluding Unscientific Postscript, and his first with Cambridge (in the series “Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy”). It is a colossal achievement.

Hannay’s key strength as a translator is his daring. Danish and English are close enough that it is often possible to retain much of Kierkegaard’s own syntax, phraseology, and even wordplay. This fact can be a convenience, but it can also be a curse; in borderline cases, it tempts the translator to sacrifice English clarity for sharper surface echoes of the Danish. To his great credit, Hannay resists this temptation unfailingly. He labors to make Kierkegaard as intelligible as possible to those of us who cannot consult the original, and he is unafraid to recast phrases, and even whole sentences, where this aim demands it.

Examples abound, but I have room for only one. So I will focus on the Postscript‘s best-known and most incendiary sentence. This concerns the character of genuine prayer. How can we tell, the Postscript asks, when a prayer to God is authentic? Is it more essential that a prayer be genuine with regard to matters of “objective” concern — i.e., that it have its theology in order, that it be addressed to the “true God” (168)? Or does it matter more that the prayer be genuine with regard to matters of “subjective” concern — i.e., that it be offered in a genuine way, in a “true relation of inwardness to God” (168)?

The Postscript famously, and to some notoriously, prefers the latter standard of authenticity. It compares a pious idolater, one who prays to his idol “with all the passion of infinity” (169), to a Christian who pays mere lip service to the genuine God. It then affirms that the passionate idolater, rather than the passionless Christian, is the one who prays aright: “The one prays in truth to God though he worships an idol; the other prays falsely to the true God, and hence worships in fact an idol.”3

Or so, at least, runs the first-stage translation (Swenson/Lowrie) of the well-known line. The second-stage (Hong) edition puts it similarly: “The one prays in truth to God although he is worshiping an idol; the other prays in untruth to the true God and is therefore in truth worshiping an idol.”4 Both of these translations follow Kierkegaard’s Danish syntax closely.5 Precisely in so doing, however, they invite us to misconstrue his meaning.

The confusion is caused by the words “in truth”, which are just the literal equivalents of the Danish "i Sandhed". In the original, i Sandhed serves as an adverbial phrase modifying the verb “prays” [beder]; it does not imply anything about the identity of the object of prayer. In English, unfortunately, it is hard to parse the above translations without taking the words “to God” to be the effective referent of “in truth.” (We read: the pious idolater "prays in truth to God although he is worshiping an idol.") This makes it seem as though getting the subjective dimension of a prayer right (the prayer’s “how”) means automatically to get its objective dimension (the prayer’s target) right as well. But that would make the identity of the prayer’s addressee utterly irrelevant to the prayer’s status as authentic or inauthentic. Any god would do.

Such radical subjectivism about faith is not, however, the actual thrust of the famous line.6 The idea is not that a prayer’s authenticity is solely a function of its how, irrespective of its target. Instead, the point is that the passionate pagan does indeed fulfill the task of praying to God despite the fact that he gets the objective dimension of his prayer wrong (he mistakes an idol for God). By contrast, the passionless Christian is so far from fulfilling the task of praying to God that he may be regarded as having utterly flouted it (namely, as though he were an enthusiast of idolatry), even if he has gotten his prayer’s objective dimension right.7

Hannay’s translation is the first to retain this crucial nuance. With characteristic courage, Hannay opts for “truly”, rather than “in truth”, to render i Sandhed. This keeps the English reader’s focus on the how of prayer rather than on the identity of the prayer’s target. Here is Hannay’s version in full: “The one prays truly to God though he worships an idol; the other prays untruly to the true God, and therefore truly worships an idol” (169). This may take a bit of getting used to, but it is an ingenious way to avert confusion. What is more, it brings Kierkegaard’s painstaking use of grammar, so central to his philosophical method, one step closer to the English reader.8

The distinction on which the above “incendiary sentence” pivots — that between subjective and objective concerns as criteria for authenticity — is in fact the key to the argument of the Postscript as a whole. Over the course of its nearly 600 pages, the Postscript works to demolish and replace a conventional view of Christianity on which being a true Christian is a matter of objective concern: a matter of grasping a certain faith-content, a certain Truth, whose validity is established by the Bible, or by the transmission-history of the Apostles’ Creed, or by Hegelian speculative theology.

Against this view, the Postscript insists that Christianity’s Truth resists validation by, and hence assimilation to, objective thinking. This means that being a true Christian turns out to be overwhelmingly a matter of subjective concern: a matter of how one relates to a Truth that is ever elusive. In this regard Socrates, who lived a life of truth-seeking amid and despite ignorance, is a helpful existential paradigm.

Yet the Postscript also insists (echoing the project of Philosophical Crumbs,9 the book to which it is a postscript) that the true Christian’s task differs from, and indeed is far harder than, Socrates’ examined life. This is so both for subjective reasons — the Christian must contend not just with ignorance, but with sin — and for objective reasons: the content of Christianity’s Truth is not just an “uncertainty”, but an “absurdity” (176). Having made these distinctions, the Postscript then tries to specify the Christian’s peculiar predicament as a sinner seeking salvation in an absurdity. And it is here that the book’s trouble begins.

As the Postscript nears its climax, it struggles to pinpoint the distinction between true Christianity and other forms of life. This turns out to require some account of the content of Christian faith. The problem is: if this content is absurd, and so defies understanding, how can it be discussed at all? The Postscript‘s uncomfortable solution is to try to wave at what it cannot touch. It discusses Christianity’s content by means of analogies which it keeps taking back, citing variations on the formula understanding is revocation (476, 477n, 487, 523). Finally — in a grand show of obedience to this same principle — the book ends by revoking itself in an appendix (523).10

A related oddity is the Postscript‘s claim to be authored not by Kierkegaard, but by the fictional author “Johannes Climacus”, who — in a further gesture of revocation — claims not to be a Christian himself. Johannes Climacus means “John of the Ladder”; it is the sobriquet of a sixth-century abbot, author of the meditative guide The Ladder of Divine Ascent. In Kierkegaard’s usage, the name is likely meant to echo the Postscript‘s own ladder-like attempt to use reason to scale the heights of a Christianity that defies understanding. In particular, “Johannes Climacus” may well echo Sextus Empiricus’s celebrated image of Pyrrhonian argument as a kind of “step-ladder”, which the user is supposed to “knock over … after his climb.”11 Kierkegaard’s Climacus, too, seems to conclude his work by knocking it over. Is the Postscript, then, a self-refuting book a là Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, which also ends by revoking itself as a Sextan ladder?12

These puzzles are thick and knotted. And a second great merit of Hannay’s Postscript is that it addresses them head-on, in a lucid Introduction. Here Hannay points out that Climacus identifies himself repeatedly as a “humorist”, meaning that he is a psychological and religious chameleon: he can think his way into all manner of walks of life without committing to any of them.

In particular, Climacus can grasp the contours of a religious world-view, and even insert himself hypothetically into such a world-view for the sake of ridiculing the world outside of it, all without committing to that world-view himself. This, according to Hannay, is why the Postscript‘s revocation should not detract from the book’s value as an analysis of Christianity. Hannay writes: “Climacus’s humour is an expression of his position near the top of the ladder. His virtue, for the reader, is that he sees the way to the top, while his value depends on his not having got there; for then he would have disappeared from view” (xvii).

This does not suffice to solve the riddle of the Revocation. But it does arm readers with the tools necessary to start grappling with it, and in fact that is all that an introduction of this kind should do. Hannay strikes a similar tone — informative, but with a light touch — in his Introduction’s second half, where he sketches the Postscript‘s various polemical targets (Hegel, of course, but even more so the Danish Hegelian pair Heiberg and Martensen, along with the Romantic theologian Grundtvig). Once again, Hannay provides enough starting information to allow the reader to begin connecting Kierkegaard’s argumentative dots. Then he steps back, prudently, from the scene.

For these reasons, Hannay’s Postscript is not merely the book’s best English translation yet; it is also the most inviting and accessible. (The book also includes a useful chronology, a well-chosen list of recommended secondary works, and helpful translator’s notes alongside the text.) Yet it is unlikely to replace the Hong edition in scholarly circles. Surprisingly, Hannay’s edition lacks marginal page references — or even a separate page concordance, as in the Hong edition — to any of the available Danish editions. This is a regrettable missed opportunity: Hannay’s Postscript could have been the first — like Marilyn Gaye Piety’s Oxford translation of Repetition and Philosophical Crumbs13 — to be keyed to the state-of-the-art Danish edition published in 2002 by the Søren Kierkegaard Research Centre. If a second edition is issued, I suggest that such references be added. They would facilitate scholarly use enormously.

I nonetheless recommend this edition highly. Aesthetically, it is a masterpiece: it brings Climacus to life in English as never before; it expertly initiates the reader into the Postscript‘s riddles and satisfactions. It is, in sum, ideal for the non-specialist reader — and the clear best choice for the undergraduate classroom.

1 Walter Lowrie, “A Bibliographical Essay: How Kierkegaard Got Into English”, in Kierkegaard, Repetition: An Essay in Experimental Psychology, tr. Walter Lowrie (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1946), pp. 177-212, p. 183. Cf. George Cotkin, Existential America (Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins UP, 2003), pp. 35-53.

2 In the best sense of the word.

3 Kierkegaard’s Concluding Unscientific Postscript, tr. David F. Swenson and Walter Lowrie (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1984), p. 180.

4 Kierkegaard, Concluding Unscientific Postscript to Philosophical Fragments, tr. Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1992), p. 201.

5 Søren Kierkegaards Skrifter, vol. 7, ed. Niels Jørgen Cappelørn et al. (Copenhagen: Gad, 2002), p. 184: "Den Ene beder i Sandhed til Gud, skjøndt han tilbeder en Afgud; den Anden beder i Usandhed til den sande Gud, og tilbeder derfor i Sandhed en Afgud.“


6 If it were, there would be little point to the sentence’s specification of “the true God” in its second half. For more on this, see Michelle Kosch, Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling, and Kierkegaard (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2006), pp. 190-195; Merold Westphal, Becoming A Self: A Reading of Kierkegaard’s Concluding Unscientific Postscript (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue UP, 1996), p. 119.

7 For more on inauthentic Christians as “pagans in Christendom”, indeed even as “below paganism”, see Kierkegaard, Christian Discourses, tr. Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (Princeton: Princeton UP, 1997), p. 12.

8 To bring us any closer than this, we would need to reproduce in English the Danish relation between Afgud [idol] and Gud [god]. One option might be to use “un-God” for Afgud instead of “idol”. We would then obtain: “The one prays truly to God though he worships an un-God; the other prays untruly to the true God, and therefore truly worships an un-God.” Here it is clear that, while (1) an inauthentic how of prayer (“untruly”) has an effect tantamount to having an inauthentic target of prayer (“un-God”), (2) an authentic how (“truly”) merely outweighs the presence of an inauthentic target (“un-God”), without replacing that target with the authentic one (“the true God”). The upshot is that the identity of the prayer’s target is not irrelevant to its authenticity; it is simply far less relevant than is the quality of the prayer’s “how”.

9 Better known as Philosophical Fragments, but Crumbs is a better reflection of the original title. A new translation under the corrected title has recently appeared: see Kierkegaard, Repetition and Philosophical Crumbs, tr. Marilyn Gaye Piety (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2009), pp. 83-173.

10 This appendix is entitled “Understanding With the Reader” (520). In keeping the principle “understanding is revocation”, the appendix specifies that it itself (as the book’s “Understanding”) is “indeed precisely the book’s Revocation” (523).

11 Sextus Empiricus, Against the Logicians, tr. Richard Arnot Home Bett (Cambridge: Cambridge UP), p. 183 [§481].

12 Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, tr. D. F. Pears and B. F. McGuinness (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1974), p. 89 [§6.54]. Henry Allison in fact argued for just such a Wittgensteinian reading of the Postscript. This reading was revived in the 1990s by James Conant; it remains hotly disputed.

13 Op. cit.