Conditionals in Context

Placeholder book cover

Christopher Gauker, Conditionals in Context, MIT Press, 2005, 333pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0262572311.

Reviewed by Anthony Everett, University of Bristol


The issue of how we should understand conditionals is obviously of great importance, not least because of the central role that conditionals seem to play in our understanding of natural necessity, causation, chance, dispositions, scientific laws, and rationality. Though it has hardly been neglected by analytic philosophers, there has been a recent series of important books devoted to this topic. But Gauker's new book on this topic offers a particularly original and sophisticated account which builds upon his earlier work in Words Without Meaning (MIT Press, 2003). Gauker is particularly concerned to emphasise the context sensitivity of conditionals. Thus, for example, normally it might be perfectly acceptable to assert the conditional if you turn the corner then you will see a blue house because in all of the prospects relevant to our conversation in which you turn the corner you will see a blue house. But in circumstances that include the prospect of a large fire raging in the immediate neighbourhood it might be illegitimate to assert that conditional since the prospects relevant to our conversation will be different and in some of these prospects you might turn the corner to find the house burnt down. Gauker sets out to capture this sort of context sensitivity in a book that is elegant, sophisticated, and comprehensive. Though some of the chapters are of quite a technical nature, the book is very clearly written and should be required reading for anyone with a serious interest in conditionals.

I begin with an overview of the book. Gauker's book divides approximately into four sections. The first section, chapters 1-3, proceeds as follows: In chapter 1 Gauker sketches his semantic theory. Roughly speaking, Gauker suggests that we consider each conversation as having a goal. This goal, together with the way the world is, will determine an objective context for that conversation. And this context determines what the interlocutors ought to do to best achieve the goal of their conversation. A primitive context is simply a set of literals -- atomic sentences and the negations of atomic sentences. More complex multi-contexts are sets of primitive contexts and/or multi-contexts. And multi-contexts can be expanded in various ways to generate a structure of such expansions. Gauker goes on to offer a recursive characterization of when a given sort of sentence counts as assertible or as deniable in a context. And, in particular, (G) characterizes the assertibility conditions of indicative conditionals:

(G) AB is assertible in a context c iff for every context k in or identical to c, if A is assertible in k them B is assertible in k.

Intuitively, the contexts within c represent a range of prospects. And a conditional may be assertible in one context but not in another in virtue of the second context representing prospects which the first does not.

In chapter 2, Gauker uses this semantic theory to provide a novel account of logical consequence while criticising various alternative conceptions including, in particular, the standard model-theoretic conception. Gauker argues instead that an argument is valid just in case in every context where the premises are assertible the conclusion is too. Chapter 3 is a comprehensive catalogue of argument forms involving conditionals to which Gauker applies his account, saying which forms he counts as valid and which he does not. In cases where the result conflicts with our intuitions, Gauker tries to explain away our contrary intuitions in a sensible and systematic manner, where possible drawing upon independently motivated considerations.

In the second section, chapter 4, Gauker compares his account of indicative conditionals with some of the leading rival accounts, including those of Stalnaker, Lycan, Barwise, and Lowe. Gauker offers a number of well taken criticisms of his rivals but of particular interest here are his criticisms of Stalnaker. Stalnaker's account invalidates the Disjunctions-to-Conditionals argument form (PQ ~PQ) but there seem to be no intuitive counter-examples to this argument form. Stalnaker himself tries to explain our inability to find such counter-examples but Gauker offers an extended, and I think convincing, argument to the effect that Stalnaker's explanation is inadequate and that we should therefore reject Stalnaker's theory.

In the third section, chapters 5-7, Gauker goes on to develop a formal semantics for his account. Though in many ways attractive, the core theory for indicative conditionals presented in chapter 5 has several defects, the most serious of which being that it invalidates several intuitively valid argument forms, including Modus Tollens, Contraposition, and Conditionals-to-Disjunctions (PQ ~PQ). Chapter 6 introduces the notions of strong assertibility and strong deniability and argues that although these argument forms are strictly invalid their instances are nevertheless, in many contexts, perfectly good arguments. To capture the sense in which these argument forms are good, Gauker introduces the notion of weak validity -- where an argument is weakly valid just in case the strong assertibility of its premise guarantees the assertibility of its conclusion. Chapter 7 extends Gauker's formal semantics to an attractive account of subjunctive conditionals. One potentially attractive feature of this account is the fact that, although it treats indicative and subjunctive conditionals differently, the semantics given for subjunctive conditionals grows directly out of that given for indicative conditionals. This allows Gauker to capture the similarities and differences between indicative and subjunctive conditionals: they are different but closely related sorts of creature validating different argument forms but governed by similar semantics. Another attractive feature of Gauker's account is that while eschewing possible worlds semantics he is able to generate a logic for subjunctive conditionals very close to that of David Lewis.

The rest of the book is taken up with various ancillary but interesting issues. Chapter 8 contains interesting discussions of "even if" and "only if" constructions together with quantified conditionals and the effects of asserting a series of conditionals with progressively strengthened, or weakened, antecedents. Gauker's discussion of "even" is of independent interest here. Chapter 9 concludes the book by providing an algorithm for deciding the validity of an argument presented in the formal language developed by Gauker.

Although Gauker's program is in many ways very attractive I nevertheless have some substantial reservations about it. More precisely, I have reservations concerning both the semantic framework within which Gauker develops his account of conditionals and this account itself. I will sketch these in turn.

My primary complaint about Gauker's semantic framework is simply that Gauker has not done enough to spell out the central ideas of his theory. We need a clearer account of conversational goals and how the goal of a conversation together with the objective state of the world determines the context for that conversation. Clearly some simple conversations have obvious goals: the goal of our conversation might be to get you to pass me the salt or lend me your car. But it is less clear, when we talk about the latest political campaign or exam results, what exactly the goals of our conversation might be.

Again, it seems far from obvious how the goals of many conversations might determine their context. To take two pointed examples, suppose I am worried that you think I do not speak English so I say something with the goal of informing you that I am Anglophone. Or suppose that my goal is to engage in a filibuster. It is hard to see how either of these goals could determine anything like context for my conversation in the sense that Gauker wants (i.e. a set of literals or a multi-context). As he himself recognizes, Gauker needs to provide a fully worked out account of these things if his semantics is to be taken seriously.

My worries about Gauker's account of conditionals are, I think, potentially more serious. Any adequate account of conditionals should seek to validate those inferences involving conditional sentences which strike us as intuitively valid and to invalidate those which strike us as intuitively invalid. And, in so far as it ends up counting certain intuitively valid forms of inference as invalid and certain intuitively valid forms of inference as invalid, it must explain why our intuitions are mistaken in these matters.

Now although Gauker's theory certainly does not equate the indicative conditional with the material conditional, Gauker's account of indicative conditionals nevertheless validates the Paradox of Material Implication (PMI) argument forms (P QP and ~Q QP) despite many people's intuitions to the contrary. On the other hand Modus Tollens, Contraposition, and the CTD argument form (PQ ~PQ) come out as strictly speaking invalid for Gauker. Gauker is well aware of these problems and tries with commendable care to soften these conflicts with our intuitions. But I am not convinced he succeeds.

Consider first Gauker's defence of the validity of the following (PMI) argument:


_______________ I will meet you tomorrow

If I die tonight then I will meet you tomorrow

Gauker suggests that there are two reasons why we mistakenly take this argument to be invalid. Firstly we may mistake the indicative conditional for a subjunctive conditional and hence mistake the valid (PMI*) for the invalid (PMI+):


_______________________ I will meet you tomorrow

If I were to die tonight then I would meet you tomorrow

Secondly, and more importantly, Gauker suggests that when we evaluate (PMI*) we have a tendency to illegitimately switch contexts as we move from premise to conclusion so that we do not evaluate both the premise and conclusion with respect to the same context. More precisely, when I evaluate the premise I will not take my death tonight to be a relevant prospect but when I evaluate the conclusion, since we do not usually expect conditionals to be asserted when their antecedents are not relevant prospects, I will take this to be a relevant prospect. Since my death tonight precludes my doing anything tomorrow, this prospect will be one where I do not meet you tomorrow. And consequently, unlike the context c with respect to which I evaluate the premise of (PMI*), the context c* with respect to which I evaluate its conclusion will be identical to or contain a context in which I die tonight is assertible but I will meet you tomorrow is not. Hence, by (G), the conclusion of (PMI*) will not be assertible in c*. Since we switch between context c and context c* without realizing it when evaluating (PMI*) we mistakenly take the premise to be assertible in a context where the conclusion is not. Hence we misjudge (PMI*) to be invalid.

The problem with these responses is that, even if they work for (PMI*), there are a host of similar arguments to which they do not apply. Consider, for example, the arguments:


________________________ It will be hot tomorrow

If Sarah lives in Queensland then it will be hot tomorrow


_________________________ 1+1=2

If Sarah lives in Queensland then 1+1=2

Many people find such arguments invalid but it is not clear how Gauker might explain this. I think it implausible to suppose that we confuse the indicative conditionals in (PMI**) and (PMI***) with subjunctive conditionals. Moreover, in contrast to the case of (PMI*), the prospect of Sarah living in Queensland does not seem to preclude its being hot tomorrow, let alone 1+1=2. So it is not clear why the context relative to which we evaluate the conclusion of (PMI**) should be identical with or contain any contexts in which it will be hot tomorrow was not assertible. Nor is it clear why the context relative to which we evaluate the conclusion of (PMI***) should be identical with or contain any contexts in which 1+1=2 was not assertible.

Gauker is imaginative and ingenious and I have no doubt that he could come up with an alternative explanation of why many of us take (PMI**) and (PMI***) to be invalid. But he would pay a price in doing so. For I suspect that whatever the reasons why we take (PMI*) -- (PMI***) to be invalid, we take them both to be invalid for the same reasons. And we should be wary of any account which had to resort to a series of different ad hoc manoeuvres to explain away our intuitions of invalidity in different cases, especially if those intuitions seem to have a common source.

My second problem with Gauker's account of conditionals is that while many of us are pessimistic about the prospects of any account of conditionals completely accommodating all our intuitions, I suspect that some of our intuitions are non-negotiable. Thus, for example, the validity of Modus Ponens is surely a non-negotiable matter and any account of 'conditionals' on which Modus Ponens fails is probably best seen as not providing an account of conditionals at all, no matter how ingenious the arguments offered for why our intuitions on this matter are not to be trusted. Now, of course, Gauker's account validates Modus Ponens. But I think it is a serious question as to whether Modus Tollens and Contraposition are negotiable argument forms or whether any account of 'conditionals' on which these fail has departed unacceptably from our concept of a conditional. I, for one, am inclined to think that we accept these argument forms, not so much because we take their individual instances to be valid, and not so much because we cannot discern any counter-examples to them, but rather because it is simply part of our concept of the indicative conditional that Modus Tollens and Contraposition hold for it. Obviously this claim requires more defence than I can provide here. But as evidence in its favour I would note that in my experience, when confronted with a McGee-style counter-example to Modus Tollens:

If a Republican wins, then if Reagan does not win then Anderson will win.

It is not the case that if Reagan does not win then Anderson will win.

A Republican will not win.

most people seem adamant that we should retain Modus Tollens and explain away the 'counter example' in some manner. Obviously there is much more that needs to be said here but I worry that Gauker's account does too much violence to our intuitions.

I have raised some worries about Gauker's account. This should not, however, detract from the fact that Gauker has produced an absolutely superb book which merits very serious attention. Gauker has, in short, set a new benchmark in treatments of conditionals.