Confronting Evils: Terrorism, Torture, Genocide

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Claudia Card, Confronting Evils: Terrorism, Torture, Genocide, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 329pp., $33.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521728362.

Reviewed by Richard Vernon, The University of Western Ontario


This impressive book, a successor to the author's The Atrocity Paradigm (2002), brings a sharply critical gaze to a wide range of topics. Part II comprises six chapters in which particular evils are confronted: both counter-terrorism and terrorism are discussed, the latter embracing "low-profile" violence such as rape; the recent torture debate is incisively analyzed, and the notion of torture extended to rape, elder abuse, and the cruel treatment of animals; an account of the specific evil of genocide is offered, and of the pathologically paradoxical enterprise of genocidal rape. It is impossible to read any of these chapters without a sense that one's perspective has been enlarged and one's sense of the critical issues enhanced. Whether or not the book as a whole is as strongly compelling as its parts, however, must inevitably depend on the reader's judgment about the coherence and identity of the idea of evil itself. Although some take the view that the idea was born in now-distant theology and is sustained mainly by vulgar political rhetoric, Claudia Card maintains that it continues to have a secular, coherent, and non-rhetorical use as a condemnatory term: we can best evaluate her claim on the basis of the chapters in Part I, which are more general in their scope.

In Chapter 1 Card makes a limited but significant modification to the definition of evil presented in her earlier book. There she had proposed that we should think of evil as reasonably foreseeable intolerable harm produced (or sustained, etc.) by culpable wrongdoing, but she now wishes to substitute "inexcusable" for "culpable" (4). Chapter 2 takes on Kant's view that there is nothing between evil and good, and also offers an alternative to Kant's interpretation of "diabolical evil." Chapters 3 and 4 carry out a promise made in chapter one, that is, to enlarge on the topic of collectively produced and collectively suffered evils, a topic that Card now thinks was given insufficient attention in her earlier book. These two chapters interestingly engage what is by now a well-developed body of scholarly literature. A very minor criticism of chapter 3 is that the space devoted appreciatively to I.M. Young could have been used to address a more diverse range of views in that literature.

In ordinary discourse the idea of "evil" is both powerfully emotive and very unclear. It is emotive because it is connected with wrongs that overstep some bound of normality and because it is connected both with assumed malevolence and with kinds of suffering that are intense or extensive or both. All of those features are manifestly porous in their meaning, which makes the term a dangerously versatile one in the hands of politicians. So it is a good thing that those features should also attract the critical attention of philosophers. But their attention could either illuminate or dissolve the term. Card's account, I believe, tends (unintentionally) in the direction of dissolving it, for she rejects the idea that the agent's malevolence is a necessary condition of an evil act and rejects the view that evil is extraordinary; so, it would seem, her account risks disposing her readers to question the value of having a term that depends not only on both of the elements that she rejects but also on an idea of their essential conjunction.

Card's definition, like the vulgar one, contains a reference to both intentional and consequential aspects and in this sense, she claims, mediates between a "Stoic" position that places all the emphasis on the former and an "Epicurean" view that places all the emphasis on the latter (8). Although evils are distinguished from lesser wrongs in that the harm involved is intolerable (5), it is also essential that they should be inexcusable. It is essential, further, that there be no good excuse (17, 23), so that trivial reasons or plain human weakness (16) would not count. A thought that arises here is that Card imposes two strong requirements that may exert some pressure upon each other. In particular, when the good-excuse condition is introduced the intentional side of the definition runs some risk of vanishing. It is up to us, not to the agent, to decide whether an act is excusable or not; and the bar is very high, since to count as evil an act has to have consequences "that we think no one should have to suffer" (7). Does this leave much space for excuses to operate in? If an event is intolerable, can those who bring it about have any excuse at all?

One relevant case discussed here is that of a choice between terrible options, so that bringing one of them about may be preferable to bringing about the other -- enslaving prisoners of war might be better than killing them (29). We are then said to be "tolerating" an evil, excusably or justifiably. This leads to the seemingly odd result that we are said to be tolerating the intolerable. But is the enslavement of prisoners still to be counted as an evil, on Card's own definition? If those who propose it are indeed motivated by the consideration that it is better than killing, they have a good (if tragic) excuse, and so enslavement does not meet the twin criteria of intolerableness and inexcusability; if it is still an evil then intolerableness, it would seem, is sufficient for its definition.

Card denies, however, that the agent's perspective can be set aside in this way. She rejects the view that people who perform the same action for different reasons are equally blamable because culpable for the same thing, for they are culpable in lacking an excuse and blamable in light of "their reasons, objectives, circumstances, faults" (23). I am not sure that we can vary blame on the basis of circumstances and faults, on Card's own argument (cited above) that human weakness does not count. As for reasons and objectives, these (Card says) affect degrees of blameworthiness. They do so, but may they not do more than that? I am not sure that we can always identify things that "no one should have to suffer" without knowing the reasons for their suffering. Here is an example: a recent book claims that the Bengal famine in 1943 should be blamed on the British Prime Minister's contempt for Indian people (Madhusree Mukerjee, Churchill's Secret War, Basic Books, 2010). That, of course, would make it indisputably evil. But a reviewer argues that we need to explain the famine, rather, in terms of a "collision of disasters" in wartime (Joseph Lelyveld, "Did Churchill Let Them Starve?" New York Review of Books, December 23, 2010, 58-9). Can we say that "no one should have to suffer" the effects of a collision of wartime disasters? We would of course say that if we thought that war itself was evil in the full Cardian sense. But that only makes the point that we may not always know how to describe the "intolerability" of outcomes independently of our explanations of them and of our moral assessment of the various agents' reasons.

There is at least one case, however, in which both agential and consequential tests are met -- interestingly, it is the case that comes closest to the vulgar understanding of evil. This is the case of "diabolical" evil. Card rejects Kant's view that it applies only to people who act for the sake of acting evilly. There is no evidence that history's moral monsters acted for the sake of being evil, Card rightly says (57), and she substitutes "doing one evil for the sake of another" (ibid.) for the "Evil be thou my good" view. So it is essential to the diabolical evilness of an act that what it aims at should be intolerable in itself, that is, intolerable independently of the motive for bringing it about. One notable classical point of reference, St Augustine's youthful episode of trivial theft -- "the pleasure lay not in the pears; it lay in the evil deed itself" (Confessions, II. 8) -- would thus be ruled out. But even if we insist that we stop well short of including juvenile thefts of fruit, would there not be some interaction between the wrong done and the wrong for the sake of which it is done?

Card may hint briefly at such an interaction in noting, in connection with the "Nero" version of diabolical evil that she isolates, the "wildly disproportionate" relation between means and ends (61). This bears little weight in her account, but perhaps it should bear more? Proportionality may be a morally relevant feature in that our assessment of what is intolerable may have to depend on the reasons for subjecting people to it, and, conversely, whether or not the reasons are good may have to depend on the costs, to others, of acting on them. Even though we have a partial list of things that mustn't be done to anyone -- and rape would be high on that list -- we don't have a complete one, nor do we have any sort of a list of things that can be pursued at any cost, as opposed to things that it would be good to do if the cost were not excessive. For the most part, we go back and forth. At one end of the spectrum, the Stoics (and St Augustine) tell us that an act is evil if the reasons for it are evil, regardless of its (intended or actual) outcomes; at the other end, consequentialists (Card's "Epicureans") tell us that outcomes are decisive. But hard judgments will fall in the middle, where proportionality may be exactly the virtue that the evil deed lacks.

If we are to go back-and-forth in this way between reason and outcome, assessing intolerableness in light of motivating purposes, and excusability in light of the alternatives available to the agent, it may become hard to see how judgments about evilness are to be reliably distinguished from ordinary moral judgments, which generally follow exactly that pattern. How, though, could they possibly be different, once we have taken both malevolence and extraordinary events out of the picture? What is left of the unreflective (or the political) meaning of the concept? Card tames the concept for philosophical use, and uses it brilliantly; but her book may not convince the skeptic of its usefulness once tamed.