Confronting Heidegger: A Critical Dialogue on Politics and Philosophy

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Gregory Fried (ed.), Confronting Heidegger: A Critical Dialogue on Politics and Philosophy, Rowman and Littlefield, 2020, 284pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781786611918.

Reviewed by Adam Knowles, Drexel University


Gregory Fried’s edited collection provides a timely intervention into a debate that returns in a cyclical fashion to the philosophical headlines: the evergreen "Heidegger Case." Unlike many edited collections which lack cohesion or at best coalesce around a loosely structured topic, Fried's aims at the specific goal of re-reading Emmanuel Faye's 2009 book Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy in Light of the Unpublished Seminars of 1933-1935 in light of the Black Notebooks.[1] Since the publication of the Black Notebooks began in 2013, it has been virtually impossible, save a few stalwart holdovers, to deny the depth of Heidegger's anti-Semitism.[2] Faye, on the contrary, has long contended that "the basis of Heidegger's work is too deeply grounded in the racist and exterminatory project of National Socialism to make up a philosophy properly so called" (54). The collection navigates the terrain between these extremes, a terrain scarred, as Faye notes, by "trench warfare" (256).

Not surprisingly, the book does not settle anything in this turbulent debate, but it does -- as Faye admits in his closing response -- at least help clarify the stakes of why agreement might not be possible. The collection is a success because Fried's desire for dialogue is genuine and is motivated by his decade-long rethinking of Heidegger. Fried expresses this in two extensive open letters composed to Faye, the first published in Philosophy Today (2011) and the second composed for this book. Faye in turn offers two extensive responses. This provides the Anglophone reader a valuable precis of his post-2009 work otherwise almost only available in French and German. This exchange opens up fascinating possibilities for the letter as a mode of dialogue and exchange -- a classic genre, of course, in philosophy, but one that is underutilized today. Fried's tone is confessional and autobiographical as he narrates his philosophical evolution through the work of Heidegger. Some of the richest contributions, such as Matthew Sharpe's, Dieter Thomä's, and Richard Polt's, reflect this autobiographical tone. Faye labels William Altman's essay "overly identitarian" and I am inclined to agree with this assessment (240). Accordingly, this review will focus on the contributions which most earnestly focus on the book's central task, including the work of Sidonie Kellerer, which is too seldom translated into English.

Although not stated explicitly, the book is motivated by two central questions: 1. Did the Black Notebooks vindicate Faye's controversial and oft-maligned interpretation of Heidegger? 2. If so, what does this mean about the future of Heidegger studies? Stated roughly, the contributions by Sharpe, Faye, and Kellerer answer affirmatively to the first question. Polt, Thomä, and Altman answer negatively. Not surprisingly, Faye vigorously defends his previous interpretation in his closing response. The true handwringing and hair-pulling happens over the approach to the second question. Polt, Fried, and Sharpe take the occasion to renounce earlier interpretations of Heidegger. Polt overtly rejects his thesis that Heidegger resisted against National Socialism in the late 1930s (122). Fried narrates his slow disavowal of his commitment to Heidegger as an ally for liberal and democratic politics (2ff.). Sharpe narrates his emergence from a philosophical training in which Heidegger was an apolitical thinker of being who committed a political "Dummheit" (78). All three offer an admirable and honest recounting of the evolution out of certain forms of socialization into these given assumptions. More work should be carried out in this direction to help narrate the sociology of these academic training practices and the place of the Heidegger myth within them.

Kellerer and Faye provide the clearest answers to the second question, with Sharpe as a partial ally. To contextualize their response it is necessary to provide a little background. The reception around the translation of Faye's book in the anglophone scholarship was often reduced down to a single sentence: "Such a work cannot continue to be placed in the philosophy section of libraries; its place is rather in the historical archives of Nazism and Hitlerism."[3] The world of Heidegger scholarship was eager for an alibi to justify not confronting Faye's book. Thus, they declared: Faye does not want Heidegger to be read; he calls for a censorship just as obtuse as Nazi book burnings! The world of Heidegger studies had what it needed to avoid reading Faye's work, for, as Fried writes in his first letter, "everything ends up getting drawn into the vortex of crypto-Nazi maneuverings" (20). The resultant response to Faye was often ad hominem and not based on close reading.

Faye's jab at Thomä for his earlier career as a journalist is petty and unnecessary, however for the most part Faye proves to be a patient and steadfast interlocutor who documents how his work has been misread (259). As Faye clarifies in his first response to Fried, his intention was not to say that Heidegger should not be read, but to say that he should no longer be read as a philosopher. Faye contends that Heidegger must instead be read as an indispensable source for understanding National Socialism. Both Kellerer and Faye reinforce this conviction by pursuing much-needed archival research. In Kellerer's case, this means investigating the production of Heidegger's Complete Works to identify omissions or distortions made to Heidegger's manuscripts.[4] A 2019 report prepared by a group of German scholars headed by Klaus Held did indeed identify a number of Nazi and anti-Semitic references distorted or omitted in the published versions.[5] This confirms to a certain degree Faye's accusation of "textual modifications, manipulations, and omissions that Heidegger engineered" (249).

The verifiable existence of practices such as these lends credibility to Faye's charge that Heidegger is not only a fraud, but also a fraud whose reputation has been abetted by a body of scholars complicit in a politics of denial -- whether wittingly or unwittingly. There is little doubt that Heidegger was the beneficiary of a lack of will to denazify not only German universities, but also specifically the discipline of philosophy. Sharpe is therefore right to say that "We need also to have familiarity with the characteristic claims of other 'conservative revolutionaries' like Jünger, Spengler, Sombart, Wundt, Krieck, Baeumler, and Carl Schmitt" (81). All too often the terms of the political debates around Heidegger reduce the complexity of the contradictory and overlapping intellectual tendencies promoted, tolerated and fostered within the space of National Socialism. For example, it is a commonplace in the scholarship that Heidegger's supposed critique of biological racism in his Nietzsche lectures was a kind of academic resistance to National Socialism. Recent historical scholarship has rendered this untenable, demonstrating instead that many leading Nazi figures were skeptical of biological racism and instead maintained fidelities to an older völkisch notion of race linked to the language, soil, landscape, and people Heidegger cultivates.[6] As Pierre Bourdieu argued in the 1975, Heidegger was a völkisch thinker (cf. Kellerer, 196).

Kellerer offers a persuasive defense of what it means to read Heidegger as a völkisch thinker. By doing this, she helps to place the readings of Heidegger, especially his indirect allusions and terminological affinities, within a broader political spectrum than was represented by a narrow and rather caricatured vision of a unified Nazi ideology.[7] Too often the debates around Heidegger have measured him against this caricatured vision of National Socialism and thus served a politics of denialism building on well-worn tropes in post-war Germany.[8] Kellerer and Faye make a long overdue call for a new research program. For instance, it is astounding that no philosopher has carried out a detailed archivally based analysis of Heidegger's role as Rector of Freiburg University from April 1933 to April 1934. This is in contrast to the compendious historical literature on the topic, which often receives little attention from philosophers.[9]

The debates in this collection testify to a peculiar predicament highlighted by Heidegger studies. Many Heidegger experts have long thought it within their purview to pass judgments on Heidegger's anti-Semitism solely from the perspective of their expertise in Heidegger's thinking. Not surprisingly, these judgments often come across as facile to anyone familiar with the intellectual history of National Socialism. A venerable body of literature on the cultural politics of National Socialism, the history of anti-Semitism, the reform of universities, the role of intellectuals and the power structures of the professoriate could help us understand the valence of Heidegger's work to his contemporary listeners. As Sharpe, Faye and Kellerer underscore, far too few philosophers demonstrate a rigorous aptitude for this scholarship and instead fall back into the comfort of siloed disciplines. This might be defensible if such scholars then refrained from passing historical judgments on Heidegger. However, the ineluctable fact that now looms over Heidegger scholarship is that, after the Black Notebooks (if not earlier), the very fact of working on Heidegger means passing a historical judgment. One is already judging the status of a thinker whose fascist affinities cannot be brushed away.

This raises a fundamental issue which I would suggest runs in the background of the dialogue between Faye and Fried. They are not just confronting Heidegger, but instead confronting the question of what it means to do the history of philosophy. It has long been academically justified to read Heidegger in the line of the "great" thinkers whom he declared to be his interlocutors: Aristotle, Plato, Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche, etc. However, Thomä's piece suggests a provocative starting point for another mode of the history of philosophy. Thomä begins with the nationalist poet and playwright Hanns Johst, discovering in Johst an imperative style equally prevalent in Heidegger. This brings Thomä into a closer proximity with Kellerer than either might admit to. Kellerer suggests expanding the scope of Heidegger's interlocutors to a broader range of völkisch thinkers, while Thomä does just this, proving the fruits of reading Heidegger against a text which perhaps has only in hindsight been declared "minor." Alice Yaeger Kaplan suggests this very method of reading fascist thinkers, reading them alongside fragments, ephemeral genres, occasional pieces -- so-called banalities.[10] As more and more of Heidegger's correspondence is made public, we have a large body of resources to help piece together the texture of Heidegger's literary world in the 1920s and 1930s. It is not a pretty sight.

The reader would be naïve to think that Fried's book solves anything, especially regarding the complex questions for which Heidegger often serves as a placeholder. But what does success in philosophy even mean? There is a venerable tradition going back to Plato which states that progress in philosophy may not mean answering questions, but instead clarifying why they cannot be answered. This volume should be measured by those standards. The generosity of its central interlocutors, their intellectual honesty, and willingness to experiment with unaccustomed forms of scholarly production reveal some of the fault lines in philosophy. What I see unfolding in the volume is a crossing of methodological boundaries.

Heidegger studies is in a state of crisis for sure, but is that crisis representative of thinker-oriented approaches to continental philosophy? By situating itself within the orbit of heroes, have certain modes of continental philosophy forgotten how to ask questions? Thomä, Fried, and Polt all find in Heidegger a source to rejuvenate philosophy's rigor for questioning. In his drive to ontologize, to turn to the forgotten and concealed layers of the history of being, they regard Heidegger as the thinker who asked the questions which others did not know could be asked. Faye and Kellerer, in contrast, see closure, dogma and a dictatorial style in Heidegger. So how to read Heidegger? Or why? The book seems to coalesce around the idea that reading Heidegger is somehow important for confronting the rise of ethno-nationalist regimes. Unfortunately, it establishes little consensus on how to do that.

Kellerer recoils, for example, at Donatella di Cesare's attempt to read Mein Kampf philosophically (201).[11] In her compelling reading, she traces continuities of themes between Hitler and Heidegger and clearly shows that, simply because one is reading the central canon of fascist thought, that does not automatically mean that one is reading it philosophically. Kellerer and Faye agree that this work should be done, but that it does not deserve the label of philosophy. Faye warns against the possibility that our readings "be condemned . . . to remain within the precinct of the history of ideas" (260). I find this adherence to labels unnecessary and unproductive, especially when this collective of thinkers seems to be working towards a common goal.

The fact, as Faye and Fried clearly document, is that Heidegger has been picked up as a source of inspiration for many neo-Nazi and ethno-nationalist movements.[12] This is not an idle problem, but one that threatens democracies globally. Of course philosophers should not hold themselves in such high esteem as to think that we can stop the global rise of authoritarian regimes. We do, however, offer tools of interpretation to point out histories, lineages and trajectories -- much like the history of ideas. This task of interpretation seems most important, not the labels put upon it. But is that not precisely the achievement of this book? Not so much clarifying anything, but instead identifying the fault lines, the sites of disagreements, and the sources of often disturbing confluences crystallized around the "Heidegger Case"?

[1] Emmanuel Faye, Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy in Light of the Unpublished Seminars of 1933-1935, Yale University Press, 2009. I date this to the publication of the translation, not the 2005 publication of the French original.

[2] The staunchest loyalist is perhaps Heidegger's final assistant Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann and Francesco Alfieri, Martin Heidegger: Die Wahrheit über die "Schwarzen Hefte", Duncker & Humboldt, 2017. It is telling that the project is an initiative of Arnulf Heidegger, the grandson of Martin.

[3] Faye, Introduction, 319.

[4] Sidonie Kellerer, "Rewording the Past: The Postwar Publication of a 1938 Lecture by Martin Heidegger," Modern Intellectual History 11,3 (2014): 575-602.

[5] Klaus Held, Marbach-Bericht über eine neue Sichtung des Heidegger-Nachlasses, Vittorio Klostermann, 2019.

[6] Devin Pendas, Mark Roseman, and Richard F. Wetzell, eds., Beyond the Racial State: Rethinking Nazi Germany, Cambridge University Press, 2017. Robert Bernasconi had long made this point in multiple essays.

[7] I pursue a similar line of analysis in Adam Knowles, Heidegger's Fascist Affinities: A Politics of Silence, Stanford, 2019.

[8] See, for example, the debates around ancient history chronicled by Johann Chapoutot, Greeks, Romans, Germans: How the Nazis Usurped Europe's Classical Past, University of California Press, 2016. I would argue that a work of this level of detail and subtlety is lacking for the discipline of philosophy.

[9] Exemplary here is Bernd Grün, Der Rektor als Führer?: die Universität Freiburg i. Br. von 1933 bis 1945, Karl Alber, 2010.

[10] Alice Yaeger Kaplan, Reproductions of Banality: Fascism, Literature, and French Intellectual Life, University of Minnesota Press, 1986.

[11] Donatella di Cesare, Heidegger and the Jews: The Black Notebooks, Polity, 2018.

[12] Ronald Beiner, Dangerous Minds: Nietzsche, Heidegger, and the Return of the Far Right, University of Pennsylvania Press, 2018.