Confucian Ethics: A Comparative Study of Self, Autonomy, and Community

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Kwong-loi Shun and David B. Wong, eds., Confucian Ethics: A Comparative Study of Self, Autonomy, and Community, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 238pp, $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521796571

Reviewed by Stephen C. Angle, Wesleyan University


What makes for a successful collection of essays? More than just good individual papers: they must engage with one another, implicitly or explicitly; ideally, such engagement will be furthered by a stimulating introduction, postface, or commentaries. A good collection, like a good conference, should aim to push our conversations forward, though of course its upshot need not be univocal. By these standards, Confucian Ethics is an outstanding achievement. The eight individual essays are excellent, and are nicely summarized in Shun and Wong's introduction. The essays cluster into two themes -- labeled by the editors as "Rights and Community" and "Self and Self-Cultivation" -- which themselves relate to and inform one another. Many of the essays, furthermore, deal explicitly with the methodology of comparative philosophy in mutually challenging ways. Finally, the volume ends with a splendid essay by Alasdair MacIntyre entitled "Questions for Confucians." MacIntyre's essay engages provocatively with the body of the collection, and should be an important stimulus to contemporary Confucian philosophizing. He makes important and controversial suggestions both on substance and on methodology, the latter drawing out implications of his own work on challenges to cross-cultural moral understanding. Taken as a whole, Confucian Ethics is a first-rate contribution to moral and political philosophy, to comparative philosophy, and to contemporary Confucian philosophy.

The book's first section is comprised of four essays that ask, each with a different goal, whether Confucianism grounds a distinctive perspective on rights that contemporary thinkers should take seriously. In "Are Individual Rights Necessary?" Craig Ihara draws on Confucian orientations in order to argue that "it is possible for people to ensure rule/role compliance and to have a sense of human dignity and worth without having the concept of individual rights" (28). Ihara's target is a famous essay by Joel Feinberg, which asserted a conceptual tie between individual rights and ideas like human dignity. Ihara convincingly shows that any connections in this vicinity are contingent; as he concludes, "whether it makes sense to promote the idea of individual rights depends on whether giving special weight to individual claims is called for by a specific set of circumstances. It should not be promoted if moral systems that do not invoke the notion of individual rights can serve as well or better" (28).

By clearing away Feinberg's overly broad argument for individual rights, Ihara helps us to see when, where, and why they are important. Ihara's position is thus consistent with MacIntyre's argument -- to be discussed below -- that the nature of the modern state requires something very much like "modern Western rights," even for Confucian communities (216). Ihara's essay is an exemplary instance of what we can call "global philosophy": that is, philosophical work that has its roots in one philosophical tradition but that develops based on an openness to dialogue with other traditions. In the case of Ihara's essay, the roots lie in Western moral philosophy, but Feinberg is criticized on the basis of broadly accessible ideas that Ihara finds in Confucianism.

David Wong's "Rights and Community in Confucianism" similarly draws on both Confucian and Western moral traditions, though his objectives are somewhat different. The centerpiece of Wong's essay is the argument that Confucianism should recognize a community-based right to free speech. It is tempting to call this argument a matter of "internal criticism" -- that is, criticism based solely in the tradition's own terms -- because Wong is emphatically not basing his argument on the foundation of liberal individualism. To label Wong's reasoning internal criticism, though, would be to obscure the role played in his thinking and argumentation by ideas from Western communitarianism, among other sources. In fact, Wong is again exemplifying global philosophy, as he shows us ways in which reasoning within a Confucian framework can be enhanced by concepts and reasons from outside.

There is a general lesson here to which I would like to call attention. Those of us who, indebted in many instances to MacIntyre's work, pay attention to the role of different traditions in articulating philosophical reasoning, often think of these traditions in too monolithic a way. For all the differences among traditions, concepts, and styles of reasoning, both Ihara and Wong show us that one can mount a coherent argument while reaching across boundaries for appropriate ideas or reasons.

In many ways, Henry Rosemont's essay in the volume is a test-case for my claim that we can be led astray by thinking of traditions in too monolithic a fashion. Rosemont's "Whose Democracy? Which Rights? A Confucian Critique of Modern Western Liberalism" explicitly invokes MacIntyre's methodology for rational comparison among incommensurable moral traditions. Rosemont argues that classical Confucianism offers a coherent alternative to modern liberalism, that liberalism fails on its own grounds, and that these failures can be explained by Confucianism. He writes: "there are alternatives to the Western liberal tradition, alternative visions that just might be endorsed by all people of good will, no matter what their cultural background" (68).

Such an "either/or" choice strikes me as wildly ahistorical -- things do not actually happen that way -- not to mention out of step with much of the rest of the volume. Indeed, while he, too, can conceive of things in too monolithic a fashion, later in this volume MacIntyre will argue that contemporary Confucians need to find a way to bring liberal rights on board. It is also true that Rosemont's favored cases (Singapore and Malaysia), for all the interest we might have in their political and social systems, are hardly based on pure Confucianism.

The question of what relevance alternative moral traditions have to moral debate today is raised in a different way by Chad Hansen in "The Normative Impact of Comparative Ethics." Distinguishing "comparative ethics" from anthropology or history, Hansen suggests that "philosophers evaluate the motivation or warrant of different normative positions against the background of the entire philosophical and conceptual system" (73). Unlike "first-order" moral discourse -- when people within a moral community debate moral questions in accord with shared norms of reasoning -- comparative ethics operates at the level of the broad moral tradition: its role is "the rather 'academic' one of exhibiting and illuminating the rich complexity and coherence of the background assumptions, concepts, and norms of reflection" (82). Hansen argues that comparative ethics can contribute to normative debates today, but only in an indirect way. Once we have shown that some moral tradition is both significantly different from our own, and robust in its own terms (i.e., major positions are developed on the basis of sound responses to internal challenges), we can accord this tradition "moral tradition respect." Hansen stresses the importance of actual responses to internal critics: "merely reciting the Confucian case and giving modern arguments for it does nothing to warrant moral tradition respect" (93). Recognition that an alternative moral tradition deserves such respect may lead us to be "mildly skeptical" about our own morality (79). We may strive for some kind of synthesis, but recognize that such a goal may be very long-term, requiring evolutionary changes within both systems.

Hansen develops his views about the strictly limited way in which comparative ethics can be relevant to current moral debates with respect both to human rights issues and to questions of virtue ethics -- an area of contemporary philosophy in which several scholars have suggested that Confucian ethics can make significant contributions. In both cases, Hansen reasons as follows. Start by granting for the sake of argument that Confucius articulated some distinctive doctrine of relevance to human rights or to virtue ethics. In the context of contemporary debates over these issues, though, "we may legitimately wonder how the fact that Confucius believed [the doctrine in question] is relevant to any rational decision we are facing" (81). If we can show that the doctrine is part of a tradition that is robustly supported against relevant challenges, we can acknowledge that the doctrine may someday have relevance as part of an eventual synthesis, but even in this case, its immediate relevance is not obvious. Since Hansen is skeptical about whether Confucianism has adequately striven to answer critics from within the Chinese tradition, furthermore, he is not even sure that moral tradition respect is merited.

There are a variety of responses one might make to all this. Certainly the idea of moral tradition respect is stimulating and of relevance to situations like those Hansen describes: cases in which adherents of one tradition reflect on the relevance of views rooted in a different tradition, where the views in question do not have any immediate appeal or resonance in terms of one's own norms. Perhaps Hansen is correct that strictly speaking, "comparative philosophy" only applies to such situations. At this point, however, two themes that I have already introduced are relevant. I have suggested that we should not think about cross-traditional discourse solely in terms of choice between one monolithic tradition and another; and I have proposed the term "global philosophy" for philosophical work that, while rooted in one tradition, makes creative and constructive use of ideas from other traditions. (To be fair, Hansen cannot be accused of concerning himself with "monolithic" traditions, because he stresses the multiple strands (Mohism, Daoism, etc.) within a broad "Chinese moral culture." But he still tends to talk of encounters between such moral cultures, rather than the messier, overlapping interactions envisioned by global philosophy.)

Hansen criticizes Bryan Van Norden's suggestion that Western advocates of virtue ethics can learn things from Confucianism. I will say more about Van Norden's specific views below, but for now note that Hansen's criticism rests on a false dichotomy: either we find moral tradition respect, or we are simply doing business-as-usual philosophy within our own tradition. According to a global philosophical approach, we may be working within our home tradition, without detailed attention to the broad discursive analysis Hansen calls comparative philosophy, and still draw importantly on elements of other traditions. This is just what we have seen Ihara and Wong do, and it is definitely not business-as-usual within contemporary Anglo-American philosophy.

The next three essays in the volume are all exemplary instances of global philosophy. Joel Kupperman draws primarily on the Analects in his "Tradition and Community in the Formation of Character and Self," but his goal is not just an interpretation of Confucius. Kupperman says that, even when juxtaposed to Hume or Hegel, "Confucius is uniquely good in his articulation of a moral psychology that explores the role of both tradition and community in the advanced stages of development of a very good self" (116). Kupperman's references to contemporary psychologists and philosophers make clear that his interest lies in what we all can learn from Confucian moral psychology, in just the way one might mine the works of Aristotle, or Hume or Hegel, for insights and philosophical direction.

In "A Theory of Confucian Selfhood," Cheng Chung-ying pursues the sense in which the "self," as understood in Confucianism, can be understood to be free. This is again a question of global philosophy, which in this case means a question of contemporary (globally informed) Confucianism. Cheng's question arises in large part because of potential contrasts between Confucianism and other world philosophies, but his answer is developed very much in Confucian terms. Cheng's essay is stimulating and I find much to agree with, but I want to raise one issue, which is his frequent (though not entirely consistent) translation of "zhi" as "will" and the related gloss of "zhi" as "an independent decision-making power" (132). Since, as we will see in a moment, Kwong-loi Shun believes that focusing on how to translate Chinese terms into English ones can be a distraction, let me emphasize that the issue here is the substantive one of how to understand zhi: is it an active "power"? Although I do not have space to argue for it here, I believe zhi is instead something one's mind (xin) does; it is to "commit" oneself, or the very "commitment" one takes on. Indeed, Cheng sometimes uses this language (132), and I feel his core ideas about freedom of self are eminently expressible without the language of free "will."

Bryan Van Norden's "The Virtue of Righteousness in Mencius" focuses mostly on understanding certain key ideas from Mencius, but it does so (once again) in a global philosophical vein, drawing on both contemporary philosophy and psychology, and contemporary scholarship on ancient Greece. Van Norden's results are two-fold. On one hand, he helps us to better understand a key point in Mencius, namely the meaning of "yi" and its relation to the "sprout (duan)" of "shame (xiu wu)." He shows, for instance, that the "shame" in question is shame in a broad, ethical sense. On the other hand, Van Norden hopes also to contribute through this work to contemporary philosophy. He concludes that "a sort of neo-Mencianism is of more than antiquarian interest and shows promise as a viable philosophic position" (175). I agree that the distinctive features of a Mencian approach to shame and to moral cultivation can contribute to current philosophical construction, and hope that Van Norden and others will continue to think through how far a "neo-Mencian" position can be developed today.

The penultimate essay in the volume is Kwong-loi Shun's "Conception of the Person in Early Confucian Thought," which is an insightful reflection that connects up in satisfying ways with earlier essays in the volume. For the purposes of this review, I want to concentrate on Shun's distinctive methodological proposal, namely, that we not "focus on the question of the applicability of certain Western notions in the study of comparative philosophy. Instead, to the extent we are interested in the substantive issues related to the use of such notions, we should focus on the range of phenomena associated with these notions and consider the extent to which they are or are not instantiated in Confucian thought. This allows us to focus on the distinctive features of Confucian thought and the way they differ from Western traditions, while sidestepping the terminological issues" (196-7). As Shun points out, depending on what one means by "rights," authors in the volume have found more or less room within Confucianism for rights. I am certainly sympathetic to the desire to be able to say something substantive without being caught up in terminological minutiae. It is important to recognize what the cost of such an approach might be, however. I have been emphasizing the virtues of a loose approach to philosophical work I am calling global philosophy. It involves an explicit openness to other traditions, openness that would not be cultivated by a refusal to use these other traditions' technical terms. Without this openness, it is hard to see how critical engagement and dialogue across traditions would be possible, and it is even possible to wonder whether Shun's goal of clarity about how Confucianism differs from Western traditions would be achievable.

I now turn to the volume's final essay, namely Alasdair MacIntyre's important and provocative "Questions for Confucians." MacIntyre is an ideal commenter on these essays. He has written incisively about Confucianism in several settings (even if it is unfortunately absent from his Dependent Rational Animals [Open Court, 1999], where Confucian ideas could have made significant contributions). The basic form of his commentary is a set of challenges: challenges both to the volume's authors, and to Confucian thinkers more generally. One challenge is methodological. He writes that we "need to distinguish between what we actually find in the texts and what we can construct from the materials provided for us in the texts" (206). He says that constructive projects are "entirely legitimate" parts of living traditions. MacIntyre continues, though, to argue that Cheng's essay, in particular, is a work of construction, and that while interesting, it is "in important respects premature" (206). We should start by emphasizing those aspects of Confucianism that are "most distinctive and least easy to assimilate to familiar Western views," if we are adequately understand the "difficulties that confront attempts to generate a conversation" in which we can genuinely learn from one another.

I think there is something to this; certainly, we lose important opportunities for mutual growth if we misread into a tradition like Confucianism our own pre-existing concepts and concerns. But I believe that MacIntyre both misunderstands Cheng's essay and the broader context in which Cheng's essay fits. Indeed, MacIntyre later charges that modern Confucians have failed to "adequately debate among themselves the crisis within Confucianism that should have been and sometimes has been generated by its encounter with modernity" (210). While there is some truth to this, on which more below, MacIntyre seems not fully aware of the degree to which Confucians have taken up such challenges, and misses the sense in which Cheng's meditation on "freedom" as it relates to the Confucian self is precisely part of such an enterprise. (One excellent source on the broader dialogue within Confucianism is the volume edited by Cheng and Nicholas Bunnin, Contemporary Chinese Philosophy [Blackwell, 2002].) MacIntyre's worries about "construction" being premature relate to his sense that there is a "thoroughgoing … incompatibility" (209) between Confucian and Western views. Curiously, he finds this idea supported in Kupperman's essay, despite the many similarities and useful opportunities for mutual dialogue that Kupperman emphasizes.

A second type of challenge that MacIntyre issues relates more directly to the volume's concern with rights. He asserts, based in part on the essays in the volume, that "the Confucian view of human nature … was always to a significant degree in tension with and often in stark contradiction to the presuppositions of the social forms in which it has for the most of its long history been embodied" (211). Furthermore, he argues that even if some form of communally based rights (such as Wong discusses) could be generated out of Confucian materials, more recent developments such as the rise of modern states and large-scale market economies necessitate Western-style individual rights. MacIntyre writes, "It follows that those who are both contemporary Confucians and also inhabitants of a modern state will be forced to lead a double life … . [Both] as members of a Confucian community and as citizens of some state, they will have to appeal to rights, but to a different conception of rights in each of their two lives" (217).

I agree that Confucian thinkers have much work to do as they seek to answer this two-pronged challenge: on the one hand, how can we deal better than the tradition did in the past with those whose capacities for "reflective self-direction" were denied in practice by the "hierarchical structures of Confucian society" (210)? On the other hand, how can the tradition, or at least its adherents, cope with the need for individual protections against the deprivations of modern states? Some of the best work in contemporary Confucian philosophy over the last decade has aimed at one or both of these challenges; in addition to the thinkers included in the present volume, Sin-yee Chan, Xia Yong, Joseph Chan, Julia Tao, and numerous others have all made important contributions. But MacIntyre is certainly right that much work still needs to be done.

I want to end with MacIntyre's idea that contemporary Confucians will be forced to lead a double life. This idea rests on a mistake that I have already discussed above, namely thinking about traditions in too monolithic a fashion. "Double life" suggests a picture that is both too simple and too distinct. The traditions in which we live and grow interpenetrate one another, in part because all of us are members of multiple, overlapping communities and various kinds of institutional structures. This is not to say that all such communities or discourses are readily commensurable with one another, but neither are they sealed off from mutual interaction and influence. As this volume shows, contemporary Confucian philosophy is best practiced as global philosophy.