Placeholder book cover

Paul R. Goldin, Confucianism, Acumen, 2011, 168pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651788.

Reviewed by Kam-por Yu, the Hong Kong Polytechnic University


Paul R. Goldin's new book, Confucianism, is a clear, reliable, scholarly, and insightful introduction to classical Confucianism. More than that, this introduction is placed within the larger context of Chinese history and culture and, more generally, to living issues in moral and political philosophy.

The book has a number of good features. It provides a perceptive definition of "Confucianism" that aptly avoids being too broad or too narrow and has certain distinctive and illuminating characteristics (p. 5). Moreover, it goes beyond common sources such as the Analects and Mencius and covers important materials in the Confucian tradition not so frequently discussed in contemporary Western works, such as Great Learning and Canon of Filial Piety, which actually have been very influential in shaping the Confucian tradition as known to the Chinese. The book also presents the grounds and lines of thinking of major Confucian philosophers so that the readers can see how they fit into the discussion of various ethical issues that are still of relevance and interest today. For example, Mencius holds that morality does not lie in denying special relationships (p. 43) and that morality and desires are not at opposite ends -- human desires are not bad, they just have to be extended (pp. 56-57).  Also, Xunzi advocates ranks and distinctions and argues that they are necessary for an orderly and harmonious society (p. 74). Such discussions are interesting not just to someone interested in the Chinese way of thinking, but also to students of philosophy who are interested in the nature of morality and its relation to concepts such as impartiality, human desires, and equality.

This book is not just a good introduction for beginners. It also contains useful references and insightful discussions that will be valuable to scholars in the field. For example, the exposition of the Confucian concept of shu (which is quite commonly regarded as the Confucian version of the golden rule) is highly original and illuminating. As Goldin points out, shu is not the same as the golden rule, since it takes roles into consideration: "shu has to be interpreted as doing unto others as you would have others do unto you if you had the same social role as they . . . Shu is not a relation between two individuated people, but between two social roles." (p. 16) Goldin's interpretation is confirmed by the Confucian texts. For example, in the Great Learning it is said,

What a man dislikes in his superiors, let him not display in the treatment of his inferiors; what he dislikes in inferiors, let him not display in the service of his superiors; what he hates in those who are before him, let him not therewith precede those who are behind him; what he hates in those who are behind him, let him not therewith follow those who are before him; what he hates to receive on the right, let him not bestow on the left; what he hates to receive on the left, let him not bestow on the right. (translation by James Legge)

What a person should do to his son is not what he would like his son to do to him, but what he thinks his own father should do to him.

This Confucian version of the golden rule provides an interesting specimen for philosophical scrutiny. As a result of the subtle difference between them, objections that are valid against the golden rule may not be valid against shu. The Confucian concept of shu has a number of features not shared by the golden rule, including the following:

(i)    It is relation or role-based: on the Confucian conception, the human community is not made up of separate individuals, but of people who are related to one another in specific ways;

(ii)  It is pluralism: there is not just one right answer for what is the right thing to do, as different ways of formulating shu are possible and they may well be equally acceptable. As Goldin points out: "varying interpretations of the demands of shu are permissible as long as people's actions rest on a legitimate basis of moral reasoning." (p. 17)

(iii) It incorporates a virtue-based dimension: for shu to be operated properly, it must be integrated with zhong ("being honest with oneself in dealing with others"): "Shu is instantly perverted if it is applied dishonestly, but self-deception is not always easy to discover and root out if one does not vigilantly review one's own actions." (p. 17)

Another of Goldin’s important insights that I would like to highlight is his emphasis on the importance of reinterpretation within the Confucian tradition. The "Confucian" tradition was started long before the time of Confucius, and it was Confucius’reinterpretation of the tradition that earned him such an important place within it. It is by reinterpretation that Confucians can maintain their tradition and be critical of it at the same time. In my view, the best example of reinterpreting the tradition is provided by Confucius himself.

Goldin gives some very good illustrations of Confucian reinterpretation.  One major example is the reinterpretation of "filial piety", which had been an important Chinese value long before Confucius:

Before Confucius it had referred to reverence for all ancestors, and mostly had to do with due sacrifice on their behalf. As with so many other moral and religious terms, Confucius and his followers radically reinterpreted it to mean appropriate behavior vis-à-vis one's parent, and not only after their death. (p. 34)

Much earlier than Confucius, filial piety was taken to mean "reverence for the ancestors". By Confucius's time, it was taken to mean "feeding one's parents". But the Confucians reinterpreted filial piety to mean "being a good child of one's parents", which basically means "being a good person". As noted by Goldin, "the end of filial piety is establishing oneself . . . true filial devotion compels children to remonstrate with their parents in cases of genuine moral disagreement." (p. 35) Such an interpretation makes the value of filial piety philosophically more sophisticated and ethically more adequate.

Another good example is the reinterpretation of "junzi" ("gentleman" or "noble person"). "Confucius redefined the old title junzi, meaning literally 'son of a lord' and denoting a member of the hereditary aristocracy, in moral terms: a junzi is someone who acts as a junzi should, regardless of his or her birth." (p. 26) Originally, junzi or noble person is a member of a social class, and whether one is a noble person depends on whether one's parent is a noble person. But with the reinterpretation by the Confucians, whether a person is a noble person depends on whether this person has noble behavior. So a person who is from the noble class may not be a noble person, and a person who is not from a noble class may well be a noble person. In the Confucian classics, the logic of inference is almost reversed: If the son behaves in a noble way, then he is a noble person, and his parents must be noble persons too. As it is said in the Book of Rites: "'Noble person' is a name given by other people. The people give him a good name, and call him the son of a noble person. This is making one's parents noble persons." (translation by James Legge, vol. 2, p. 267) It is for this reason that a person who becomes a noble person through his conduct is regarded as having done the duty of filial piety to his parents.

The Confucians like to commend people or deeds for being able to hold together at the same time opposite and competing (good) features, for example, "refined and substantial", "cordial and stern", "respectful and easy", "simple and reverential" (see The Analects, 6.18, 7.38, 6.2). I think Goldin's book can be commended in a similar way: it is short and substantial, lucid and learned, faithful and insightful, resourceful and relevant, as well as sympathetic and critical. It is rightly described on the back cover of the book as "the best introduction to classical Confucian philosophy currently available."  Taking into consideration the size of the book, the crisp prose, the solid scholarship, the reliable exposition, the philosophical rigor, and the insightful expositions, it can indeed be regarded as the best introduction to Confucianism.