Confusion of Tongues: A Theory of Normative Language

Placeholder book cover

Stephen Finlay, Confusion of Tongues: A Theory of Normative Language, Oxford University Press, 2014, 278pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199347490.

Reviewed by Matthew Chrisman, University of Edinburgh


Metaethicists have long been interested in the meaning of the words 'good', 'ought', and 'reasons'. Many are persuaded that, although we might analyze one or another of these words in terms of the others, there's no breaking out of the circle of normative concepts when explaining the meaning of such words. This has led to the prominence of three main kinds of metaethical view. Nonnaturalists explain the irreducibility of the meaning of normative words by claiming that normative words denote sui generis normative properties, supervenient on but not identical to natural properties. A posteriori reductive naturalists explain this irreducibility by claiming that normative words express different concepts from words characteristic of description of the natural facts, but they propose (or at least hold out hope for) a substantive empirical reduction of the properties denoted by these words to natural properties. Expressivists explain the irreducibility by claiming that normative words play a fundamentally different role in expressing our mental states to that played by words expressing representations of pieces of the natural world.

Stephen Finlay boldly attempts to undermine this pervasive assumption of irreducibility by proposing and defending specific reductive analyses of 'good', 'ought', and 'reason'. That is, he develops detailed accounts of the meanings of these words in terms that do not deploy any (obviously) normative concepts, situating these accounts in more general accounts of the semantics and pragmatics of language, and defending them against potential objections. It is an audacious project, and the book is well written, carefully argued, and impressively thorough in its scholarship. As such, it sets a new agenda in metaethics and should be read by all metaethicists and anyone else interested in the semantics and pragmatics of normative language.

There are two key ideas at the heart of the project. First, alongside moral uses of 'good', 'ought', and 'reason', there are familiar nonmoral (though perhaps weakly "normative") instrumental uses and also recognizably nonnormative uses; yet these words do not seem to be ambiguous between moral, instrumental, and nonnormative meanings. Because of this, we should hold out hope for reductive analyses based on conservative extensions of the correct analysis of instrumental and nonnormative uses of these words. Second, instrumental uses of these words are reductively analyzable in terms of how they are explicitly or implicitly related to ends via probabilities. So -- Finlay hypothesizes -- we might unify the reductive analysis of these words by also viewing moral uses of these words as probabilistically related to ends, where because of the pragmatics of normative discourse it is often advantageous to leave the relevant end implicit.

Finlay develops these ideas in detail, not only defending a novel form of reductive naturalism in metaethics, but also usefully bringing the discussion into contact with important issues about disagreement, objectivity, context-sensitivity, syntax of modals and attributive adjectives, the semantics/pragmatic divide, and more general philosophical methodology. In what follows, I won't discuss any of these interesting issues. Instead I focus on the two key ideas mentioned above, seeking first to explain Finlay's use of them and then to press on them in ways that might problematize Finlay's claim to have defended a naturalistically reductive account of normativity. To keep the discussion manageable, I'll focus on his treatment of 'ought', but I believe similar comments apply to his treatment of 'good'. (He interprets 'reason' in terms of explanations why, where "normative" reasons refer to explanations why something is good, and this is then reduced using the end-relative theory of 'good').

Finlay's End-Relational Account of 'Ought'

Moral philosophers are often inclined to explain the meaning of 'ought' in terms of some agent's having sufficient reason to do something. This seems about right when it comes to the sorts of ought-sentences we tend to focus on in practical philosophy, e.g., "One ought always to follow maxims one could consistently allow to be universal law," or "Sarah ought to keep her promise." However, not all ought-sentences are about agents acting or plausibly entail reasons: e.g., "There ought not be childhood death and disease," "Poison ought to be used in order to murder quietly." Moreover, some ought-sentences seem predictive rather than (even weakly) "normative," e.g., "It ought to rain tomorrow."

Interestingly, this diversity is not an accident of English. Similar considerations apply to other modal auxiliaries, such as 'must' and 'may'; this also appears to be a cross-linguistically robust phenomenon, suggesting that 'ought' is not ambiguous. For this reason, semanticists following Kratzer (1981) and inspired by a rich tradition in deontic logic typically treat 'ought' as a contextually sensitive necessity modal, which yields a rough-and-ready formula for interpreting any ought-sentence: treat it as saying that some embedded ("prejacent") proposition is true at all of some contextually determined set of possible worlds (e.g., those determined by what's morally ideal given background conditions, what's the most efficient way to achieve some end, or what's highly ranked by some probability measure, etc.).

Finlay is very much alive to the attractions of this unifying explanation. However, he is also moved by two further facts: First, 'ought' seems semantically weaker than 'must' -- a contrast that isn't adequately captured in the standard analysis. Second, analyzing ought-sentences in terms of a proposition's being true in all worlds in some contextually determined set, where this set is specified in terms of things like what's morally ideal, is manifestly nonreductive in the sense at issue in metaethics. To avoid these costs, Finlay proposes to generalize the intuitive interpretation of predictive (or "epistemic") 'ought's in terms of probability, by first extending it to cover instrumental 'ought's and then to cover other uses of 'ought' (including "moral" 'ought's).

To start, we use the intuitive analysis of epistemic 'ought', e.g., in "It ought to rain tomorrow", as meaning that the probability (given contextually fixed background conditions, which in this case is the evidence relevant to the claim) of the prejacent, i.e., that it rains tomorrow, is higher than any of the relevant alternatives. This makes for an easy contrast with 'must' by interpreting epistemic must-sentences as meaning that the probability (given similarly fixed background conditions) of their prejacent is 1.

Then, Finlay argues that "pure" instrumental uses of 'ought' -- i.e., where it's clear that there's only one salient end -- can be treated in terms of the prejacent's higher probability, given contextually fixed background conditions plus the assumption that the end will be achieved. For instance, he interprets "In order for Max to evade arrest, he ought to mingle with the crowd," as meaning that the probability (given contextually fixed background conditions plus the assumption that Max will evade arrest) that Max mingles with the crowd is higher than any relevant alternative.

So, according to Finlay, what makes this an instrumental 'ought' and in that (weak) sense "normative" rather than epistemic is the addition of an end to the set of propositions against which we evaluate the relative likelihood of its prejacent. Otherwise, this is just like the interpretation given for the epistemic 'ought' (and we get a parallel contrast with instrumental uses of 'must'). That's Finlay's first key idea mentioned above in action: instrumentally normative ought-statements are reduced to probabilistic statements, where the probability is relative to the obtaining of the end.

Next, he argues that other (more robustly) normative uses of 'ought' also evaluate the probability of their prejacent proposition given contextually fixed background conditions plus the assumption that some end will be achieved, but the determination of the relevant end is much more complicated. I won't go into many of the nuances about how Finlay thinks this works at the interface of semantics and pragmatics of normative discourse, except to note two things.

First, according to his analysis, the end to which an ought-sentence's meaning is relativized needn't be desired by the agent who is called upon to act in its accord (or even desired by a fully informed/rational counterpart of this agent). For example, Finlay suggests that "Max ought to turn himself in" could be interpreted in context as meaning that (given background conditions and the assumption that Max will do what's morally right) the probability that Max turns himself in is higher than any relevant alternative. Accordingly, this moral ought-statement could be true, whether or not Max wants (intends, is trying, would come to want if fully informed/rational, etc.) to do what is morally right. This is meant to capture an important sense in which moral ought-statements are "categorical."

Second, Finlay argues that there may be strong pragmatic reasons for speakers to elide explicit mention of the relevant end in particular contexts. For example, if we were speaking to Max, and it's clear that he doesn't want to do what's morally right but rather to evade arrest, we might say "You ought to turn yourself in," thereby presupposing something clearly false (i.e., that Max wants to do what's morally right). Why would we do that? Finlay argues it's because this provides a conversational mechanism for putting moralistic pressure on Max to change his desires. Making the end explicit, in this sort of case, would undermine this effect of our speech act. That's the second key idea mentioned above in action: moral ought-statements are reduced to probabilistic end-relative claim with a particular pragmatic effect.

Hence, for Finlay, 'ought' is always and everywhere analyzed in terms of its prejacent's being more probable than any relevant alternative. Differences in use are explained by contextual variations in the background conditions and comparison class relative to which this probability is evaluated. An ought-sentence is "normative" -- whether in the weak instrumental sense or in some other stronger sense -- when some end is added to the background conditions relative to which the probability of the prejacent is evaluated. This is a unifying analysis and one that doesn't use obviously normative terms to explain the meaning of a normative term -- so it has a strong claim to being reductive. There are many interesting and important details that I am glossing over, but hopefully that's already enough to appreciate the attraction of a view like Finlay's. In what remains, I want to raise a few vague worries about the idea that normativity can be reduced to probabilistic relations to ends and then press on the idea that this analysis legitimates Finlay's claim to naturalism.

Do Ends + Probability = Normativity?

How does the analysis extend to high-level moral claims, such as "Max ought to live morally"? Although Max's living morally may promote various independent ends (e.g., not feeling guilt, making people like him), it's wrong to think that moral principles like this one are related to ends like those. Rather, as we sometimes say, he ought to do it "for its own sake."

Finlay takes this locution very seriously, suggesting that statements like this one often have meanings relativized to propositions representing ends that are the very things mentioned in the sentences themselves. That is to say he'd say this statement could in certain moralistic contexts mean that Max's living morally is most probable, given background conditions plus the assumption that Max will live morally.

Three worries: First, this undermines the attractive contrast Finlay is otherwise able to draw between the semantics of 'ought' and 'must', since the probability that Max will live morally given that he will live morally is obviously 1. Second, it implies that various (obviously?) false moral claims are true. For instance, someone who said, "Max ought to count blades of grass for its own sake" would (as far as I can tell) count as uttering a true proposition on Finlay's view, since the probability of Max's counting blades of grass, given the assumption that he will count blades of grass, is clearly very high. Third, on Finlay's view, both plausible and implausible claims about what someone ought to do for its own sake come out trivially true, whereas we might have thought there could be room in some cases for the feeling of an open-question about whether, e.g., Max ought to live morally or live in a way that promotes his own personal wellbeing (where these might conflict).

Finlay makes several claims related to these worries. He suggests (p. 172-174) that even if the semantic contrast between ‘ought’ and ‘must’ sometimes collapses on his account, there are still pragmatic differences between uses of ‘ought’ and ‘must’ where both express trivially true propositions. In the long and subtle chapter 8 on disagreement he proposes to defend a "quasi-expressivist" and "quasi-absolutist" account of normative disagreement. Although it treats ought-sentences as robustly truth-apt, it agrees with the expressivist that the point of many moral ought-claims is to express a preference, and that disagreements with such claims will often amount to disagreement in preferences rather than disagreement in beliefs. Although it treats these claims as end-relative, it agrees with the absolutist that we ordinarily take them to express beliefs in non-relative propositions. So, perhaps Finlay could say that the for-it's-own-sake ought-claims we take to be obviously false are ones we "disagree" with in the expressivist sense of disagreeing in preference; and, we have the feeling of an open-question because we wrongly take these claims to be expressing beliefs in non-relative propositions.

I'm not sure if that will work, but let me turn to a different but related issue concerning the relation between means and ends in moral ought-claims. As Finlay explains, in his end-relational theory of normative language, he is "using 'end' as a term of art for any proposition conceived as a potential outcome." (p. 32) As I explained above, it doesn't matter whether these are desired by the relevant agent; ends are simply representations of states of affairs that we might move closer to. He uses examples like "winning the election is moving toward the state of affairs that the election is won." (p. 32)

There is, however, a rich tradition in moral philosophy of insisting that moral ends aren't like this. Aristotle argued that living morally isn't a state of affairs plausibly conceived as an outcome of actions like telling the truth, paying one's debts, helping the needy, etc. Rather doing these sorts of things is, on the Aristotelian view, the immediate actualization of the ongoing activity of living morally. Can Finlay's view make sense of that idea?

Although his standard cases aren't like this, he does suggest that "Not all means . . . occur before their ends . . . sometimes they're simultaneous, as with constitutive means." (p. 66) So, we might ask: can the idea of constitutive means make sense of a claim such as "Max ought to help the needy," where we think he ought to do this in order to live morally? I'm unsure. Is it plausible that the semantic connection in this case between Max's helping the needy and Max's living morally is probabilistic? To be sure, if helping the needy is an immediate actualization of living morally, then proportion of possibilities where Max helps the needy in the space of possibilities where he lives morally may be greater than relevant alternatives. Holding everything fixed, however, the proportion of possibilities where Max lives morally in the space of possibilities where he helps the needy may also be greater than relevant alternatives. The probabilistic relation between these two propositions often goes both ways. Nevertheless, there seems to be an important way in which living morally normatively grounds helping the needy, and not vice versa. The normative relation is unidirectional. Because of this, I'm worried that the probabilistic reduction of normativity to the way ends are related to means isn't going to be able to capture the way actions can actualize the end of living morally. A lot will depend on how exactly we conceive of probabilities and the nature of ends, and I suspect probabilistic relations between states of affairs is not going to be rich enough.

How Far Can Finlay Claim Naturalism?

Taking a step back from the details discussed so far, let's say that we accept Finlay's reduction of normative terms to probabilistic terms. Does that mean that he has shown that normative properties just are a species of natural properties, thereby analytically reducing the normative to the natural? Only if we assume that probabilistic terms represent natural properties, and I think there is reason to worry about this assumption.

Finlay doesn't define "natural", but he does helpfully describe his methodology as follows:

I shall employ an analytic method, seeking a metaphysical analysis of normative facts, properties, and relations by means of a conceptual analysis of the meanings of the normative words by which we refer to them. The result will be a form of analytic reductionism (or "analytic naturalism"), an explanatory reduction of normative properties (etc.) into complexes of non-normative properties by reductively defining normative words and concepts in entirely non-normative terms. (p. 4)

This suggests that all it takes for a property to count as "natural" is for it to be non-normative. That, however, is clearly wrong (and can't really be what Finlay means, which he is quite clear about in his nice survey article "Four Faces of Moral Realism"). If we reduced normative properties into non-normative super-natural properties (e.g., through some sort of divine command theory), that clearly wouldn't count as a form of "analytic naturalism" in the sense that is at issue in metaethics. Hence, the more precise (though still frustratingly vague) characterization of a natural property typically used in metaethics is of a property that is countenanced by the best (scientific) theory of reality (e.g., that to which physics, chemistry, and biology are a good guide). But -- here's the worry -- are probabilities countenanced by the best scientific theory of reality?

It's tempting to think that contemporary scientific theory is rife with appeals to statistics and chance, so probabilistic terms must have one of the best claims to count as representing natural properties. As Finlay recognizes, however, the sense of 'more probable' that he needs in his analysis of normative terms is one that encompasses not only so-called objective chances but also subjective likelihoods.

Hence, the all-important question (on which Finlay's claim to be an analytic naturalist appears to hang) is whether, in addition to objective chances, the best scientific theory of reality countenances subjective likelihoods -- somehow, out there, as properties of entities in our otherwise naturalistic ontology. Is the subjective likelihood of Max's mingling with the crowd something countenanced by the best (scientific) theory of reality or something reducible to that which is countenanced by the best (scientific) theory of reality?

This is obviously not the place to answer this question, but let me note two prominent answers that seem to cohere poorly with Finlay's claim to naturalism. First, some want to analyze subjective probabilities in normative terms, e.g., in terms of what credence one ought to have in a proposition. Second (perhaps compatibly or independently), some want to analyze subjective probabilities in an expressivist fashion, e.g., not in representational terms but rather in terms of the expression of (nonbelief) credences (cf. Blackburn 1980, Price 1983, Yalcin 2007, 2011).

Finlay says precious little about this debate (I think the only place is in the final paragraph on p. 248 where he rejects the normative analysis), though he does consider the objection that 'probability' is ambiguous between objective and subjective senses, threatening the prospects for a unifying semantics of 'good' in terms of probabilities. In response, he writes, "unifying treatments of objective and subjective probability are possible, and for expository purposes in this book I'll assume a simple and conservative model of this kind, though an end-relational semantics should be compatible with other models." (p. 44)

As far as I can tell, Finlay's end-relative semantics is compatible with the normative and expressivist treatments of probability, but not in a way that would uphold his claim to analytic naturalism. Moreover, the model he adopts for expository purposes is one that analyzes "probability as a measure of a possibility-space, a set of possibilities . . . defined by consistency with a partial description of a world-state." (p. 44) This raises some thorny questions: Are "measurements of a probability-space" themselves representations of reality? Could such measurements be incorporated into partial descriptions of a world state? Does our best theory of reality countenance the existence of probability-spaces, i.e., sets of possibilities? Those who disfavor modal realism might be skeptical. They'll insist that, although some of our modes of thought and discourse might be helpfully modeled with theories that quantify over possibilities, this should be viewed as a useful heuristic rather than a serious part of our ontology. Finlay may of course disagree, but surprisingly, it seems, his claim to naturalism in metaethics quickly gets pushed back to this arcane issue of modal metaphysics.

So, all in all, this is an excellent book -- bold and thorough. However, I'm skeptical of some of the details, and these turn out to be surprisingly important for whether we credit Finlay with successfully defending a novel form of analytic naturalism in metaethics or (merely!) advancing our understanding of the way in which normative terms are related to ends in a rich semantics and pragmatics for normative discourse.


Blackburn, S. (1980). "Truth, Realism, and the Regulation of Theory." Midwest Studies in Philosophy 5: 353-372.

Kratzer, A. (1981). "The Notional Category of Modality." In H. J. Eikmeyer and H. Rieser (eds.), Words, Worlds, and Contexts: New Approaches in Word Semantics (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter).

Price, H. (1983). "Does 'Probably' Modify Sense?" Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61: 396-408.

Yalcin, S. (2007). "Epistemic Modals." Mind 116: 983-1026.

Yalcin, S. (2011). "Nonfactualism about Epistemic Modality." In A. Egan and B. Weatherson (eds.), Epistemic Modality, pp. 295-332 (Oxford: Oxford University Press),