Conscience and Conviction: The Case for Civil Disobedience

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Kimberley Brownlee, Conscience and Conviction: The Case for Civil Disobedience, Oxford University Press, 2012, 260pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199592944

Reviewed by Alon Harel, Hebrew University of Jerusalem


In her thorough, careful and insightful discussion, Kimberley Brownlee explores the nature of conscience and conscientious convictions and draws important conclusions concerning the justifiable protection of acts of civil disobedience. The first part of her book discusses morality while the second part discusses law. In addition to its rigorous analysis, the book contains lively discussions of real-life examples and hypotheticals designed to illustrate and address all possible objections and establish the centrality of the protection of conscientious convictions and conscience in a liberal society. I will first describe some of the book's main themes. I then argue that: a) Brownlee's analysis over-rationalizes the concepts of conscientious convictions and conscience and fails to acknowledge the significance of subjective moral convictions which do not meet her strict requirements of rationality; b) Brownlee's claims concerning public officials and the optimal protection of acts of civil disobedience performed by public officials fail to take into account the significance of acting in the name of the state. I argue that performing acts "in the name of the state" requires a greater degree of deference to state's decrees than acknowledged by Brownlee.[1]

While the book inevitably discusses a variety of issues which extend much beyond conscience and disobedience, its primary and most important claims can be divided under three headings: i) it provides new characterizations of conscientious conviction, conscience and also of civil disobedience which differ in important respects from the traditional liberal characterization, ii) it establishes the (moral) justifiability of civil disobedience and its status as a moral right, and iii) it establishes the justifiability of (qualified) legal exemption from criminal conviction for acts of civil disobedience. Most significantly Brownlee believes, in contrast to the dominant tradition in liberal theory developed by Rawls as well as the dominant legal doctrines, that civil disobedience is more defensible on moral grounds than private conscientious objection and it ought to benefit from broad although not absolute legal immunity (7). In her view, it is precisely when one's moral convictions are communicated publically in ways satisfying certain conditions of consistency and meeting certain logical and evidential standards that they merit respect and give rise to moral and legal rights. The two basic concepts providing the basis for the normative analysis are: conscientious moral conviction (chapter 1) and conscience (chapter 2). Let me briefly describe these two concepts and then turn to a normative analysis.

Conscientious moral convictions differ from private conscientious objection in that the former unlike the latter are communicative (29-30). The communicative principle of conscientiousness has four conditions: 1) a consistency condition, 2) a universality condition, 3) a non-evasion condition, and 4) a dialogic condition. While Brownlee's discussion is subtle and nuanced, the conditions she sets out limit the scope of what counts as conscientious convictions and impose strict conditions on what merits moral and legal protection. Conscientious convictions as understood by Brownlee ought to be "cognitive and reflective"; "hot-headed unthinking, brute devotion" are not part of what she classifies as conscientious conviction (40). The conscientious convictions ought to satisfy certain logical and evidentiary standards. Further, the convictions ought to be dialogic, namely based on the willingness of the agent to communicate her convictions to others in an effort to engage them in reasoned deliberation about its merits (42). One can identify in Brownlee's analysis both conditions that set formal "thin" requirements of rationality (the consistency and the universality conditions) and conditions that require that the conscientious convictions be public (or communicative) rather than private (the non-evasion and the dialogic conditions). Yet, despite these requirements, conscientious convictions need not necessarily be correct or sound. Brownlee is as keen to protect the human rights or animal rights activists as the Neo-Nazis. Any one of those has "a moral right to engage in certain constrained, communicative breaches of law in defence of her cause" (7).

Brownlee turns then to explore the notion of conscience itself, which she characterizes as "an evaluative property", and which differs from mere conscientiousness. Most importantly, conscience is characterized by moral responsiveness. In her view: "Having conscience means not just taking morality seriously (conscientiousness), but also being genuinely, self-consciously morally responsive." (52). What is distinctive about conscience is that: "it makes us broadly aware of the actual moral quality of our own and others' conduct"(83).

Brownlee next explores the resulting moral responsibilities. In particular, she considers "what normative force our moral responsibilities have when they bump up against the formal expectations of the society" (85-86). These expectations "typically include following the law, carrying out institutional functions, and respecting the norms of the society" (86). To investigate those, Brownlee defends two theses: the gap thesis and the moral role thesis. The gap thesis identifies the fact that even in a reasonably just society there is a gap between the "formal codifiabledictates of normatively legitimate offices and positions and the broadly non-codifiable moral responsibilities" (86). The moral role thesis states that in cases of non-trivial divergences between the two it is morally obligatory for an agent (ceteris paribus) to depart from formal expectations and follow her moral responsibilities (87). In Brownlee's view, even public officials must reflect "on the moral merits of the formal expectations we face. The police officer must reflect on the merits of the call to use certain interrogation techniques. The prison guard and parole officer must reflect on the merits of the order to incarcerate someone." (103). Further, in her analysis, Brownlee does not differentiate between the public official and the citizen. They are both subject to the same deliberative duties, namely, the duties to reflect on the moral merits of their actions and, in cases of a conflict between the moral responsibilities and the formal expectations, to follow (at least as a presumptive matter) the former. Brownlee denies, therefore, the distinctive characteristics of public officials and may without acknowledging it join forces with some sociologists such as Zygmunt Bauman who believes that the horrors of modernity, in particular genocide, are attributable to the development of official roles separated from one's moral role.[2]

Both conscience and conscientious moral convictions give rise to moral rights. Conscience gives rise to a moral right that protects our ability to honor special moral responsibilities (126-128). Conscientious moral convictions give rise to two moral rights including: 1) a moral right to inner control and free thought (128-139), and 2) a moral right to conscientious action including free expression and civil disobedience (140-151). In her discussion of civil disobedience, Brownlee extends the moral right to civil disobedience much beyond what is accepted by traditional liberal theorists. She believes that public officials ought often to act in a way that subverts their official duties when there is a conflict between these duties and general moral considerations (91-92).

Brownlee discusses the legal implications of her analysis in Part II. She believes that there ought to be two main legal defences for principled disobedience: 1) an excusatory defence of demands of conviction, and 2) a justificatory defence of necessity. The excusatory defence rests on personal autonomy and psychological integrity. Autonomy requires that the agent act based on her commitments and, further, that the agent be able to provide reasons (or partial reasons) for our believing that she had an undefeated reason to act (168). Psychological integrity is based (at least in part) on the willingness to acknowledge the significance of personal commitments and ideals. The justificatory defence is the defence of necessity, which is shown by Brownlee to be much broader than is currently appreciated. It requires one to protect minimal needs that include: "expressive agency, a degree of autonomy, social inclusion, respect and recognition" (190). The law ought to recognize these needs and sometimes ought to give priority to them over other values that the law is designed to protect. The scope of protecting acts of civil disobedience is, in her view, much broader than the scope of protection favored by traditional liberal theorists.

I wish to critically explore two issues. First, I want to challenge the strong requirements of rationality and the communicative requirements Brownlee sets out, and secondly, to question her analysis of the responsibilities public officials have.

I believe that incoherent convictions, including the type of convictions Brownlee labels as "obsessions", are crucial for moral development and in particular for developing the type of rational and communicative moral convictions Brownlee favors. Mature, public rational conscientious convictions do not leap as Athena did full-grown and armed from Zeus' head. They often involve a personal internal struggle with oneself and require a long time of interior incoherent private deliberation to mature and crystalize. Without acknowledging the significance of the incoherent non-dialogic or evasive moral convictions, one cannot provide a hospitable atmosphere for the development of rational and communicative convictions that Brownlee is so keen to protect. In other words, I wish to suggest that Brownlee fails to acknowledge the significance of the process in which incoherent and non-communicative moral convictions gradually develop and gain maturity. What is lacking in Brownlee's analysis is empathy towards the fate of the agonizing agent who experiments with ideas -- the agent who is struggling hesitatingly to develop moral convictions that she is yet not willing to share. Such an agent would inevitably fall under the category she labels as "non-communicative disobedience." But, if I am right, the type of mature rational communicable moral convictions that merit protection according to Brownlee can only flourish if inconsistent, non-communicable experimental moral beliefs are protected.

My second concern is that Brownlee fails to consider the moral significance of official roles, in particular the significance of public officials. I would argue that the duty to comply with "the formal expectations of these positions" is much stronger than is acknowledged by Brownlee. Its strength is attributable to the fact that such acts must (sometimes) be performed in the name of the state and, to the extent that the public official has (as Brownlee believes) a veto right based on her moral convictions, such acts cannot be attributed to the state and cannot be done in its name.

As described earlier, Brownlee contrasts sharply between moral responsibilities on the one hand and formal expectations of public positions on the other hand. She believes that whenever there is a conflict between the two a person ought to follow (at least presumptively) her moral responsibilities (87). She goes further than most theorists in examining disobedience. For instance she says:

This opens the door to the idea . . . that a soldier has no general moral obligation to deploy and may often have an obligation to refuse to deploy or to refuse to carry out orders in war since deploying or following orders can depart from and threaten the genuine moral responsibilities that legitimate the office of the soldier. For the same reason, a police officer may have an obligation to decline to arrest a known offender even though instructed to do so. (91-92)

The two examples used by Brownlee (war and law enforcement) are intriguing precisely because they touch upon tasks that are at the core of the state's duties. She insists that in such cases, state officials ought to reason, make judgments and act on the basis of their own moral convictions. To see the radical implications of this, assume that I am convinced that the sentence for theft in my jurisdiction is too harsh or too lenient. I believe that (as a matter of justice) thieves deserve shorter or longer periods of incarceration than those determined by the law. Brownlee would argue that ceteris paribus as a prison warden it is my duty to release the prisoner earlier or incarcerate him for longer than the period to which the prisoner was sentenced and that (at least ceteris paribus) as a judge I ought to impose a more lenient or more harsh sanction that that entrenched in the law.

This seems to me to be wrong. I believe that Brownlee made a fundamental mistake in drawing a sharp dichotomy between "moral responsibilities" on the one hand and "formal expectations" on the other. More particularly, I shall argue that the moral responsibilities of public officials differ fundamentally from those of citizens, since the former act (at least sometimes) "in the name of the state" and, acting in the name of the state requires a degree of deference to the formal expectations of the office. As Dorfman and I have argued at length,[3] it is often the (moral) duty of the official to defer to the (unjust) judgments of the sovereign in order for the act to be attributable to the state.

Let's establish this claim in two steps. First, there are "inherently public goods", namely goods that "cannot be specified and realized apart from the state institutions providing these goods." Second, public provision presupposes deference on the part of public officials. If this is so, it follows that public officials must sometimes defer to unjust dictates to be able to provide inherently public goods.

One paradigmatic example of an inherently public good is criminal punishment. After all, sanctioning a wrongdoer is an expressive/communicative act of condemnation. It is a public manifestation of condemnation and disapprobation of the criminal deeds. Unlike deterrence and perhaps other goals of punishment, public condemnation is possible in the first place only if it emanates from the appropriate agent. Condemnation is ineffective unless done by an agent who is in a privileged status in relation to the one subjected to the condemnation, namely, one whose judgments concerning the appropriateness of behavior are worthy of attention or respect. Punishment is distinguished from mere violence by the fact that the state is a legitimate authority not only for the purpose of judging the wrongfulness of our actions but also for inflicting the punishment for the right reasons.

But, to the extent that the infliction of the criminal sanction hinges on the private judgment of the prison warden or the judge (as argued by Brownlee), it seems wrong to attribute the sanction to the state. In what respect can one say that the punishment is inflicted by the state if it hinges on the moral conviction of the official who inflicts it? To articulate this claim, Dorman and I differentiated between "fidelity of reason" on the one hand and "fidelity of deference" on the other hand and argued that public officials must act on the basis of fidelity of deference for the act to count as a state's act. The deference requirement demands that, for the purpose of administrating the execution of official pronouncements, an official must suppress his or her own judgment (concerning the method of execution) and open up to the sovereign's judgment.

Needless to say that this may raise serious concerns, as we all know that blind obedience is the clear mark of the worst horrors of civilization.[4] But, at the same time, public officials have duties of deference which are much broader than those characterizing private citizens for reasons that are not acknowledged by Brownlee, namely for the reason that the provision of inherently public goods hinges on their deference.

Brownlee has made an important contribution to the literature on civil disobedience. Her contribution will be a starting point for the future philosophical discussion of conscience and the protection of conscience in a liberal society. My critical observations are reminders that such discussions as rigorous as they may be never end in complete non-controversial judgments; they give rise to new questions and challenges.

[1] This part is based on my joint article with Aivihay Dorman: The Case against Privatization (forthcoming in Philosophy and Public Affairs, Winter 2013).

[2] Zygmunt Bauman, Modernity and the Holocaust (1989).

[3] Supra note 1.

[4] I explored the limits of obedience in Alon Harel, Outsourcing Violence 6 Law and Ethics of Human Rights 395, 412 (2011).