Conscience and Corporate Culture

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Kenneth E. Goodpaster, Conscience and Corporate Culture, Blackwell Publishing, 2007, 306pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405130407.

Reviewed by Jeffery Smith, University of Redlands


Kenneth Goodpaster's work over the last two decades has proven to be some of the most important in business ethics.  Conscience and Corporate Culture continues his efforts by integrating the philosophical case for corporate conscience with an analysis of how corporations can implement progressive moral change.  This aspect of Goodpaster's book — its conceptual rigor and applicability — makes it truly thought provoking for applied philosophers and essential reading for those involved in business practice.

Goodpaster opens the first part of his book with a novel psychological explanation of recent corporate moral failures.  Both individuals and corporations possess "mindsets."  One such mindset is called teleopathy, or the "unbalanced pursuit of goals."  Goodpaster believes that teleopathy is a pathological problem and it has played a significant role in blinding corporate managers to otherwise obvious moral problems. It is worth pausing a moment to discuss the elements of Goodpaster's explanation.

A mindset is best understood as a set of "habits and practices that are action-guiding and not merely thought-guiding" (p. 35).  These habits and practices (broadly construed) can lead to both attuned and unattuned decision making and action, depending upon their strength, focus and object of concern.  A mindset is normatively neutral insofar as there can presumably be habits and practices that can succeed or fail with regard to certain moral outcomes.

Teleopathy is a mindset that reflects imbalance; in particular, it reflects imbalance in the pursuit of goals to the detriment of other ends that may have instrumental or moral significance.  The symptoms of teleopathy are a fixation on certain goals, a social detachment that permits a singular focus on such goals (regardless of who they adversely affect) and an ability to rationalize or justify this singular focus.  There are layers of added complexity here; the tendencies toward fixation, detachment and rationalization are encouraged in corporations that enforce behavioral scripts, provide incentives for short-term thinking and otherwise encourage narrow measures of success, such as profitability, growth in stock price or enhanced competitive position.

Goodpaster introduces the mindset of "conscience" as a prescription against the problems caused by teleopathy.  This is instructive on a number of levels.  First, since conscience is itself a mindset, i.e., a set of habits and practices, one might say that a mindset can only be changed by replacing it with another mindset.  We think, conceive, react and prescribe based upon habits and practices; without habits and practices there is no decision making or action.  It is therefore appropriate that we can counteract the elements of teleopathy only through a constructive substitution of other tendencies, both individual and corporate.  Second, conscience is not a monolithic habit of heart, habit of the mind or social practice; rather, it, like teleopathy, is composed of a variety of intentional states (or quasi-intentional states) that involve beliefs, attitudes and dispositions of character.  Individuals (or organizations) with conscience exhibit thoughtfulness, awareness, unique insight and show a willingness to identify with others and impartially consider their welfare (pp. 50-54).  Finally, conscience is a set of habits and practices that enhances a consideration of self along with others.  In this regard it is a mindset that focuses our attention on others; conscience is a way to move closer to a moral point of view, from which individuals can see the possibilities of how to best balance one's own needs and interests with the needs and interests of others.

Corporate conscience is, first and foremost, a method of internal control.  The development of conscience is a way that moral constraints can become part of each functional decision in corporate life.  The regulation of markets through well-intentioned and even well-crafted laws is, at best, a response that would be much better handled if ethics were integrated into corporate decision making practices from the beginning. Corporations of conscience are therefore corporations that take seriously the need to examine their goals in relation to other moral and non-moral ends.

What does Goodpaster offer to elucidate this important notion of conscience?  Conscience involves thoughtfulness, awareness, insight, identification and impartiality.  Individuals and organizations of conscience will not simply follow routines, but they will examine their purpose.  Conscience demands subtle and nuanced vision, an ability to recognize the facts and circumstances that call forth thoughtful responses.  Conscience, too, requires that we pay attention to how our actions affect others.  The basic idea that one acts among others constitutes moral insight.  Our moral insight is strengthened by two distinct capacities: identification with others, i.e., a willingness to base our decisions on the will of others; and impartial consideration of others' interest by distancing ourselves from our own.

Conscience involves a willingness to engage in three general types of thinking.  First, a person or corporation of conscience is drawn to "think" in general terms.  In making decisions and taking actions, one should reflect not simply on one's own ends, but on the ends of others, whether specific others or others who are only known to be humans.  This is found most vividly in Goodpaster's call for impartiality; however, it is implicit in his call for identification as well.  We are to identify with others by making decisions as if they were endorsed by other affected parties.

The second dimension of conscience is also worth mentioning; conscience requires agents to be intimately connected with the particularitiesof decision and policy making contexts.  Thoughtfulness and awareness are especially context sensitive.  Awareness requires not simply an understanding of whose interests are at stake, but the relationships, laws, cultural expectations and concrete histories that are implicated in the present situation.  In this regard the capacity to be fully aware is a capacity to better apply the general insights that one obtains through identification and impartiality.  Being thoughtful also puts pressure on agents to scrutinize the particulars of their situation.  The creativity and open-mindedness that are cultivated by being thoughtful are, first and foremost, intellectual traits which involve thinking about nuance and novelty, not simply generality.

A final aspect worth mentioning here is the way in which conscience is attitudinal.  I have suggested that conscience, for Goodpaster, is not monolithic in the sense that it is not an identifiable skill, core trait, or single belief.  It is better to represent conscience in its complexity as an attitude that manifests itself through the exercise of other practical and intellectual virtues, requiring habituation and practice.  It is an attitude that orchestrates tolerance, intellectual honesty, creativity, open-mindedness, sensitivity, perspective and the like.  It follows from this observation that conscience, like other attitudes, is open-ended, imprecise and difficult to exercise.  Worse yet, the kind of practical and intellectual exercise we get from an "imbalanced pursuit of goals" is much easier to tolerate than the difficult exercise that comes with the mindset of conscience.  It is for these reasons that the development of conscience involves civil, political, corporate and interpersonal efforts.

The second part of Conscience and Corporate Culture is largely devoted to this practical challenge of concretely describing how corporations emerge with a conscience.  This is a difficult task, but one that someone with Goodpaster's philosophical training and corporate experience is well-positioned to complete.  His analysis focuses on how four organizational traits, reflectiveness, humility, anticipation, and community involvement, can be made manifest through an array of corporate strategies, governance structures, information systems, employment practices and leadership styles.  He marshals a number of examples, including large corporations such Medtronic, Inc., H. J. Heinz Company, and Microsoft, to explain the ways in which these traits can be brought to fruition at the corporate level as part of the development of corporate conscience.

A number of generalizations can be drawn for the sake of brevity.  Corporations of conscience are adept at aligning individual incentives with moral values.  They exhibit integrity, i.e., there is coherence between corporate aspirations, moral constraints and the way in which corporations reward individual employees.  Executive leaders in corporations of conscience tend to be decisive.  Such leaders also have a healthy sense of how they and their management team are fallible; accordingly, the checks and balances against possible moral failure are well planned and designed to anticipate moral problems.  Corporations of conscience are not afraid to celebrate moral achievement and actively participate in civil society organizations designed to promote norms of business conduct.  Goodpaster highlights the Caux Roundtable Principles as one example of such an effort.

It is perhaps an understatement to say that Conscience and Corporate Culture could easily be divided into separate books.  There are places where the sheer breadth of the book overwhelms Goodpaster's ability to refine the distinctions that he draws and explore in greater detail the recommendations that he offers.  This weakness, however, is also part of its strength.  The ability of Goodpaster to move between philosophical ideas, literature in management and actual cases is not only impressive; it also makes the book accessible and relevant to academic and practitioner audiences in a way that other seminal works in normative business ethics have yet to do.  It is for this reason that Conscience and Corporate Culture will quickly distinguish itself in the literature.