Conscience in Reproductive Health Care: Prioritizing Patient Interests

Conscience In Reproductive Health Care Prioritizing Patient Interests

Carolyn McLeod, Conscience in Reproductive Health Care: Prioritizing Patient Interests, Oxford University Press, 2020, 204pp. $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732723.

Reviewed by Doug McConnell, University of Oxford


Carolyn McLeod’s book is essential reading for ethicists interested in conscientious objection in healthcare. Her central argument is that the very nature of the fiduciary relationship between healthcare professional and patient requires the professional to prioritise the patient’s healthcare interests over their own interests. Her arguments apply to those who primarily want protection for their consciences and not those who publicly refuse to provide services as civilly disobedient acts aimed at changing the law or standards of practice. McLeod focusses on the reproductive services of abortion and emergency contraception (EC), but her views are readily extended to any case of conscientious refusal to provide ‘standard’ healthcare services, that is, legally permitted services considered good care by the professional institution. Although others have occasionally noted that fiduciary relationships count against accommodating conscientious refusals of service, McLeod shows that the restrictions that fiduciary relationships place on conscientious refusals are much more significant and pervasive than previously thought. McLeod’s line of argumentation is also novel in that it focusses primarily on what professionals owe their patients rather than what they owe their profession.

Part 1 of the two-part book assesses the interests at stake for professionals with conscientious objections to standard services and patients requesting those services. McLeod sets out in detail how conscientious refusals of reproductive services can seriously harm individual patients and undermine public health, even when effective referrals are provided. Refusals are not, therefore, merely inconvenient for patients, as some defenders of conscientious refusals have claimed.

I found McLeod’s analysis of the nature and value of conscience a highlight of Part 1. Not only is it interesting as a work of moral psychology, it also heads off the common complaint that those who aim to restrict conscience only do so because they take an anaemic view of it. McLeod begins by arguing against the widely held view that conscience has value because it helps to preserve inner moral unity. She points out that strong forms of moral unity are not necessarily valuable because one might unify oneself around an oppressed identity, e.g., a woman who believes that women should be subordinate to men. Although McLeod admits that a lesser degree of moral unity has value because it is required for moral agency, she argues that acting against one’s conscience doesn’t necessarily threaten that unity. We typically maintain the inner moral unity needed for moral agency despite acting against our consciences because we rationalise or find excuses for our actions. Furthermore, the moral unity needed for moral agency can be lost because one acted on conscience, such as, when whistleblowers’ mental health is ruined by the powers they have tried to hold to account.

This leads McLeod to develop her ‘Socio-political, Dynamic View’ of conscience, whereby conscience functions ‘not to preserve inner unity, but to encourage us simply to act on our moral values. . . . Our conscience can alert us to how deeply committed we are to certain values, and can prompt us, in turn, to embrace different values’ (33–4). Like many theorists, McLeod takes conscience and moral judgment to be different capacities. Conscience is a capacity to sense when an action is wrong and it typically comes unbidden, while moral judgment is under more conscious control and can rank actions on a continuum from wrong to supererogatory. McLeod’s view is unique, however, in thinking that conscience and moral judgment should influence each other. When our conscience and moral judgments are aligned, we feel confident that we are acting in accord with our moral values. However, sometimes conscience and moral judgment come into conflict. Conflicts can arise when new moral knowledge brings the recommendations of conscience into question, perhaps because conscience has been shaped by oppressive cultural forces. Equally, conscience sometimes reveals that our occurrent moral judgments are fickle or inaccurate and should be overridden by the more deeply held moral commitments represented by conscience. This dynamic, reflective process of resolving these conflicts allows us to achieve a form of self-critical moral integrity as opposed to forming a non-critical unity around whatever moral values we happen to have. On McLeod’s view it is wrong to assume that all consciences deserve equal protection. A conscience is worthy of less respect where it is the ‘stagnant reminder of internalised oppression’ (40) or where a person adopts and abandons moral commitments without good reason. Nevertheless, McLeod accepts that conscientiously objecting healthcare professionals typically engage in sufficient moral reflection that their consciences are worthy of protection.

The overall conclusion of Part 1 is that both conscientiously objecting healthcare professionals and patients requesting standard reproductive services have important interests at stake. Therefore, we cannot easily solve the conflict by simply dismissing either party’s claim as insignificant. McLeod’s detailed analysis of the conflicting interests will be particularly relevant to theorists who believe that the relative weight of professional and patient interests is central to whether conscientious refusals should be accommodated. However, for McLeod, exactly how much is at stake for each party is beside the point, because the fiduciary relationship requires the prioritisation of patient interests even if the conscientiously objecting professional has more to lose.

Part 2 opens by arguing against compromise approaches and, in particular, the ‘conventional compromise’, that conscientious refusals can be accommodated but refusers must provide effective referrals. McLeod argues that typical conscientious refusers have no good reason to accept the conventional compromise and neither are we likely to be able to find a compromise that will work for them. In part, this is for the familiar reason that providing referrals makes one complicit in the patient receiving the service one objects to. The difficulty is that there just isn’t any middle ground between thinking that abortion amounts to murder and thinking that it isn’t murder at all. McLeod runs through the typical reasons given for why objecting professionals should accept a compromise and finds them all wanting. McLeod’s positive thesis doesn’t depend on the success of her arguments here—she doesn’t think that conscientious refusers should be offered a compromise—but those who defend compromise approaches will find much to mull over.

The rest of Part 2 is devoted to developing her positive thesis. In Chapter 5, McLeod draws on legal theory to set out the distinguishing features of being a fiduciary, namely, having authorised, discretionary power over significant practical interests of the beneficiary. To act as a fiduciary, one must prioritise the beneficiaries’ interests over one’s own within the sphere one has been authorised to act. An inherent feature of fiduciary relationships is that beneficiaries are vulnerable to the fiduciary abusing their discretionary authority because beneficiaries are unable to assess whether the fiduciary really is acting in their best interests. This entails, both conceptually and morally, that fiduciaries have a duty of fidelity or loyalty to their beneficiaries.

McLeod argues that established healthcare relationships are fiduciary relationships—patients have authorised healthcare professionals to exercise discretionary power in pursuit of the patient’s significant healthcare interests. Therefore, healthcare professionals should ensure they act in the patient’s best interests. This includes ensuring the patient receives the standard services they request even if such services clash with the professional’s conscience. To put acting on one’s conscience ahead of the patient’s healthcare interests would be an abuse of power. Healthcare professionals can use effective referrals to avoid providing standard services to existing patients but only if it is in the patient’s best interests, for example if the professional’s moral outrage compromises their ability to care for the patient. In Chapter 6, McLeod extends her argument from existing patients to prospective patients by arguing that all the hallmarks of fiduciary relationships also obtain between healthcare professionals and the public. In this context, the loyalty is to purposes not individuals, namely, ensuring equitable access to care and public health. Therefore, professionals don’t have to treat just any patient that asks because, for example, they might already have all the patients they can manage so to take on another would undermine their care of existing patients. Importantly, however, one cannot turn a patient away for conscience reasons but only to ensure equitable care and public health.

I found McLeod’s positive thesis highly convincing. The alternatives to fiduciary relationships, such as contractual relationships, make space for conscientious refusals but they seem certain to lead to worse healthcare because patients lack the specialist knowledge to protect their own interests. If good quality healthcare is the primary goal of the healthcare system, then it should not be sacrificed to increase the conscientious freedoms of healthcare professionals. A particular strength of McLeod’s view is that the limitations on conscientious refusal apply wherever fiduciary relationships exist. This means that a range of healthcare professionals, not just physicians, must prioritise patients’ interests. Pharmacists, for example, are fiduciaries when they act as gatekeepers for treatment, such as EC, because they are responsible for patient care; they must judge whether a medication is indicated, explain its method of use, and alert the patient to side effects. Similarly, professionals in both public and private healthcare systems engage in fiduciary relationships with their patients, so private providers cannot claim that their bespoke institutional values allow them to make conscientious refusals.

Some readers might agree with McLeod’s main thesis—that patient interests should be prioritised—but worry that she is too lenient in allowing professionals to refer patients when the professional’s conscience threatens to undermine quality care. If professionals make such referrals insincerely (or self-deceptively), then the rate of conscience motivated referrals may end up being nearly as frequent as under the conventional compromise. One aspect of McLeod’s view which can counteract excessive conscientious refusals, is that she believes it is morally unjustified to refer an existing patient who doesn’t want to be referred. In other words, patients can override conscientious refusals made in their interests. However, and I expect McLeod would agree, the power dynamic in the clinic will make it likely that patients will tend to accept referrals that are more than inconvenient to them. In any case, it will often be unwise to insist on treatment because the objecting physician might well be correct about their inability to provide good care. Those who take a hard-line against refusals of service might think that conscientious objectors should face penalties for making referrals even when they claim it would be in the patient’s interests. This would motivate professionals to avoid roles that require them to provide services they object to or, if they insist on taking those roles, to simply provide the requested services (albeit at some risk to patients).

Another point at which some might think McLeod offers professionals too much discretionary space is where she suggests that professionals can refuse services that clash with their judgments of what their professional role entails. When considering the case of professionals objecting to sex selective abortion, she says that, although they cannot conscientiously refuse to provide this service, they might object on the grounds that a desire to have a male child is not a healthcare interest. This refusal can be morally permissible because it ‘does not stem from personal conscience but from the professional’s understanding of their professional role’ (144n46).

The problem is that some professionals might have unusual views about the healthcare profession, views that most patients would not agree with. Therefore, allowing professionals to act on their judgments about good healthcare seems likely to undermine good healthcare (albeit probably to a lesser extent than letting professionals act on their personal consciences). This suggests that it would be better to insist on a stricter fiduciary relationship whereby professionals must act consistently with what their professional institution judges to be good healthcare. However, if one insists that professionals must act on what their professional institution says, then one faces the problem of corrupt institutions, such as the Nazi Germany case. Regarding this scenario, McLeod says that professionals can justifiably refuse to, say, impose treatment on competent patients, because

there is little moral value in preserving the professional’s role so understood and the integrity of the profession that is built around it. At the same time, there is moral value in allowing these professionals to use their discretionary authority and expertise to decide what they will do for . . . patients. (146)

So there is a trade-off—one has to balance the risk of a corrupt professional institution against the risk of professionals making inaccurate judgments about the role of the profession. It isn’t totally clear what McLeod’s view on this is. She seems to come down in favour of professional discretion in the cases cited above, but elsewhere she says that it would be unacceptable for a professional to refuse to provide EC in pursuit of public health because that would directly contradict the professional institution (173–4). But this case seems similar to the person refusing to provide sex-selective abortion, since that too directly contradicts their professional institution. It seems we need a principled means of identifying corrupt institutions that can be rightly overridden by professional judgment and/or a standard to assess which professional judgments of good healthcare can be justifiably followed even if they conflict with non-corrupt professional institutions.

Assuming McLeod does allow refusals of some services based on professional judgment about the limits of one’s profession, I was not completely convinced by her claim that these cannot be conscientious refusals. McLeod assumes that conscientious refusals can be neatly distinguished from professional views about the proper limits of one’s profession. But is this right? I agree that the latter are not conscientious in the strict sense but I don’t see such a clear distinction between the two. The person who refuses to perform sex selective abortion on the grounds that the profession should not count sex selection as a healthcare interest is likely to have been significantly influenced by their conscience in coming to that judgment. Conscientious objectors to providing abortions and EC could often reformulate their objections in terms of the proper limits of their profession. It doesn’t strike me as necessarily insincere to do so; it could just be a matter of developing consistency between one’s personal morality and the morality one would like to see expressed in one’s profession. If I am right, then there might be room for quasi-conscientious refusals within McLeod’s framework; however, this is unlikely to satisfy many of those who argue in favour of healthcare professionals having wide conscientious freedoms.

Overall, McLeod’s book is an excellent contribution to the literature on conscientious objection in healthcare. She shows how the fiduciary relationship requires healthcare professionals to prioritise patient interests and that this severely restricts conscientious refusals of standard services. Her arguments pose a serious problem for those who think that conscientious refusals of service are compatible with good healthcare.