Conscientious Objection in Health Care: An Ethical Analysis

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Mark R. Wicclair, Conscientious Objection in Health Care: An Ethical Analysis, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 252pp., $31.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521735438.

Reviewed by Laurence B. McCullough, Baylor College of Medicine and Rice University


Mark Wicclair's remarkable and timely book provides a clinically and philosophically comprehensive account of conscientious objection in healthcare. He addresses conscientious refusal to participate in aspects of reproductive medicine such as prescription or dispensing of Plan B contraception (for use after unprotected sexual intercourse to prevent pregnancy, believed by many -- mistakenly -- to be an abortifacient), which will be familiar to readers of this review, especially those interested in bioethics and the ethics of reproductive medicine and health policy. He also addresses the less familiar topic of terminal sedation, in which the effective clinical management of the pain, distress, and suffering of some terminally ill patients requires sedation into unconsciousness. With appropriate consent, artificial nutrition and hydration, which advance directive laws of the various states regard as life-sustaining treatment, are discontinued and the patient then dies. Death may occur sooner than it would have otherwise. Some believe that the cause of death changes from the patient's terminal condition to the lethal metabolic complications resulting from lack of nutrition and hydration. Conscientious objection is made against clinically justified (because it protects and promotes the health-related interests of patients according to professional standards of clinical judgment and practice), ethically justified (because there is valid consent), and legally justified (because permitted or sanctioned by law) forms of clinical management. The ethical challenges of conscientious objection are of long standing in healthcare and have recently come to public prominence.

Wicclair's is the first book-length study of those ethical challenges and gives conscientious objection in healthcare the sustained scholarly and philosophical attention that a topic of such major philosophical, clinical, and health policy import requires. He provides an account of both individual and organizational conscientious objection in health care. His scope is impressively comprehensive: individual conscientious objection by healthcare professionals in medicine, nursing, and pharmacy; organizational conscientious objection by pharmacies and healthcare institutions such as hospitals; individual conscientious objection by students and residents; and conscience clauses in organizational and health policy. No other resource offers such a broad scope, making this book an invaluable resource for healthcare professionals, the leaders of healthcare organizations, trainees, and policy makers. Wicclair's rigorous, carefully developed and systematically deployed ethical analysis of conscientious objection makes the book of special interest to philosophers. It rewards close reading in the best way: the reader is given very good philosophical work to do throughout.

Wicclair begins his philosophical account by canvassing competing accounts of the concept of conscience and conscience-based objections and identifies their shared appeal to core moral beliefs: "Core moral beliefs are an agent's fundamental moral beliefs" (4). On this basis he provides an account of conscience-based refusal:

An agent's refusal to provide a good or service is a conscience-based refusal if an only if: (1) the agent has a core set of moral (i.e., ethical or religious) beliefs; (2) providing the good or service is incompatible with the agent's core beliefs; and (3) the agent's refusal is based on her core moral beliefs (5).

Conscience is worth preserving because doing so protects and promotes moral integrity and moral integrity is worth preserving for a variety reasons, including its essential role in the formulation and living of a good life and the "devastating" (26) effects on individuals of not preserving moral integrity.

Wicclair's second chapter deploys a close and critical reading of three approaches to conscientious objection: "conscience absolutism;" "the incompatibility thesis;" and "compromise."

According to conscience absolutism, in addition to not having an obligation to provide a good or service that violates a healthcare professional's conscience, the professional is not obligated directly or indirectly to participate in its provision or facilitate patient access to it (34).

The "incompatibility thesis" embraces the assumption that

conscience-based refusals to provide legal and professionally permitted goods and services within the scope of a practitioner's competence are incompatible with the practitioner's professional obligations (33).

The "compromise approach," for which Wicclair argues -- and that constitutes a signal contribution of this book to professional healthcare ethics and health policy -- rejects both the conscience absolutism and the incompatibility thesis.

I will explain and defend a compromise approach based on the core professional obligations of physicians, nurses, and pharmacists. Contrary to conscience absolutism, I will argue that core professional obligations justify several constraints on the exercise of conscience by physicians, nurses, and pharmacists. Contrary to the incompatibility thesis, I will maintain that if health care professionals do not violate these constraints, the exercise of conscience can be compatible with fulfilling core professional obligations (34).

One of the significant philosophical contributions of this book is Wicclair's close and detailed critical reading of an impressive range of approaches to medical, nursing, and pharmacy ethics to identify which of the three approaches each takes. Any notion that a reader may bring that professional healthcare ethics is uniform on these topics and therefore on its reasoning about and positions on conscientious objections will be thoroughly dispelled. To use the discourse of clinical medicine, this is one of the most valuable "take-home lessons" from this book.

Wicclair's third chapter continues his close reading and analysis of the concept of the professional obligations of clinicians to patients. The professional ethics of medicine, nursing, and pharmacy agree on

three core professional obligations -- i.e., obligations to patients which are central to its [each profession's] self-definition or identify and provide a basis for more specific obligations. These are an obligation to respect patient dignity and refrain from discrimination, an obligation to promote patient health and well-being, and an obligation to respect patient autonomy (88).

These core professional obligations generate ethically justified constraints on conscience "in relation to (1) discrimination, (2) patient harms and burdens, (3) disclosing options, (4) referral and/or facilitating a transfer, and (5) advance notification" (92), all of which are explored in considerable depth and nuance.

This chapter has major implications for professional medical ethics. Consider the most recent edition of the "Ethics Manual" of the American College of Physicians, one of the most comprehensive and detailed guides to professional ethics of any of the specialty organizations of physicians:

A physician who objects to these services [abortion, sterilization, contraception] is not obligated to recommend, perform, or prescribe them. As in any other medical situation, however, the physician has a duty to inform the patient about care options and alternatives, or refer the patient for such information, so that the patient's rights are not constrained.

Read in light of Wicclair's carefully reasoned and nuanced account, this guidance needs to be reworked, perhaps extensively.

Wicclair acknowledges the conceptual challenges of claiming that social institutions such as hospitals or hospital systems can be said to have a conscience, much less conscience-based objections to providing some forms of healthcare. Wicclair makes the interesting move of claiming that "claims can be advanced on behalf of health care institutions that bear a family resemblance to appeals to conscience by individuals and warrant substantial deference" (148). Healthcare institutions can and do have a "distinct identity," expressed in mission statements and organizational practices and policies, that "provide the basis for what might be considered analogues to appeals to conscience" (149), i.e., when the organization appeals to its core or basic values. This can certainly be the case for healthcare organizations sponsored by a faith community, including multiple Christian and non-Christian faith communities. Other healthcare organizations, notably retail pharmacy chains, "cannot plausibly advance appeals to conscience," (166), Wicclair argues. Recognizing the ethical heterogeneity of healthcare organizations becomes another valuable take-home lesson.

Wicclair next considers conscience-based objections of health professions students and trainees and argues that conscience-based exemptions are important and also ethically permissible, under constraints of demanding considerations that any ethically acceptable policy must effectively address: " (1) established core educational requirements, (2) local core curricula, (3) non-discrimination, (4) impact on patients, and (5) impact on students, residents, and supervisors" (201). Thus, for example, it might be permissible to exempt medical students or residents in obstetrics and gynecology from participating in procedures to terminate pregnancy (induced abortion or in utero feticide) but require students and residents to master the scientific and clinical fund of knowledge about how these procedures are performed and to diagnose and manage their complications, because every student and resident in obstetrics and gynecology is expected to be able to provide care for patients in these respects.

Wicclair concludes by considering public policy related to conscientious objections in healthcare. He argues that many "conscience clauses" provide too much protection to individual conscience, because they do not take adequate account of the ethically justified constraints on conscience that he defends in previous chapters. He also argues that these conscience clauses do not protect positive duties of conscience and are therefore inadequate.

Wicclair's book is a model of how to undertake scientifically and clinically very well informed, philosophically sophisticated ethical analysis of a complex, current, and important topic in the ethics of the healthcare professions, the ethics and leadership of healthcare organizations and health professions education, and in health policy. He shows that conscientious objection in healthcare is of a piece in all these domains, subject to the binding constraints of professional responsibility to and for patients. Organizational ethics, pedagogical ethics, and policy ethics in healthcare, as it were, recapitulate professional healthcare ethics. Wicclair's book can be used to considerable advantage to teach the ethics of conscientious objection in healthcare to health professions students, in undergraduate courses on bioethics, and in graduate courses that explore the nature and limits of appeals to conscience, a topic with a long philosophical (and theological) history. Leaders of healthcare organizations and policy makers should keep this book ready to hand.


Snyder L, for the American College of Physicians Ethics, Professionalism, and Human Rights Committee. American College of Physicians Ethics Manual, Sixth Edition. Annals of Internal Medicine 2012; 156: 73-104.