Consciousness and Fundamental Reality

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Philip Goff, Consciousness and Fundamental Reality, Oxford University Press, 2017, 290pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190677015.

Reviewed by Daniel Stoljar, Australian National University


This book is an interesting and energetic exploration of Russellian monism, a position in philosophy of mind that has gained considerable attention in recent years because it promises to move us beyond the physicalist-dualist stand-off. In the first part, Goff presents a critique of physicalism; in the second, he discusses the pros and cons of different versions of Russellian monism. Ultimately, he recommends a version he calls 'cosmopsychism', the bracing idea that the universe itself instantiates a form of consciousness.

Overall, the book is honest, unflinching, imaginative and argumentative; in other words, a very good philosophy book. Is it persuasive? I don't think so, and I say this not as a critic of Russellian monism, but as a fellow traveller. I agree with Goff that the truth lies somewhere in the vicinity of Russellian monism, but I think Goff has missed the most plausible development of the view. I will try to explain this by saying something about the first part of the book, and then something longer about the second. But, before turning to that, what is Russellian monism exactly, and how does it differ from standard physicalism and dualism?

The physicalist holds, roughly, that every instantiated property is either identical to or grounded in some physical property. The dualist objects that physicalism is false, since there are instantiated phenomenal properties -- properties associated with the consciousness of humans and other creatures -- that are neither identical to nor grounded in such properties. On this issue, Russellian monists side with dualism.

The dualist holds, roughly, that almost every instantiated property is either identical to or grounded in some physical property; the exception is phenomenal properties, which are fundamental, i.e. not grounded in anything. The physicalist objects that this makes it impossible to account for the evident integration of phenomenal and other instantiated properties. On this issue, Russellian monists side with physicalists.

How can Russellian monists side with the physicalist against the dualist and with the dualist against the physicalist? How can they thread the needle? The basic idea is to draw a subtle distinction between two classes of properties. In the first class are those properties that physics tells us about. In the second class are those properties that capture the intrinsic nature of matter or, more generally, the physical world. The Russellian monist argues that these classes of properties are different: the first is restricted to structural or dispositional properties; the second contains non-structural or non-dispositional properties.

If this point is accepted, and if we interpret physicalism as concerning the first class of properties, it is possible to reject both it and dualism. Physicalism is false since phenomenal properties are not identical to or grounded in the structural properties that physics tells us about. But dualism is false too since phenomenal properties are identical to or grounded in the properties that capture the intrinsic nature of matter.

As I said, in the first part of this book, Goff gives his reason to reject physicalism. Of course, there are already well-known arguments here, such as the knowledge argument and the conceivability argument; indeed, these are precisely the arguments appealed to by standard dualists. But Goff prefers an argument based on what is often called 'revelation' (or 'phenomenal transparency'), according to which "phenomenal concepts reveal the complete nature of the conscious states they refer to" (p.124). He summarizes it this way: "we know what pain is through feeling pain, and hence if pain were c-fibers firing, we'd know about it. But we don't, so it isn't" (p.125, italics in original).

Actually, this argument is well discussed in the literature too, and I think it has several drawbacks. I will mention three.

First, the revelation argument apparently proves too little, since it targets identity versions of physicalism rather than grounding versions. In the passage I just quoted, Goff is assuming that physicalists hold that pain is identical to c-fibers firing. But what if they hold instead that pain is grounded in c-fibers firing, rather than being identical to it? Now the argument as stated above doesn't apply, and it is not easy to see how to adjust it so that it does. Of course, Goff himself goes on later to say it does apply (pp.147-8), but the matter is complicated since he also says that "grasping the essence of a property does not entail grasping the essence of a property that grounds it" (p. 198).

Second, if the argument were adjusted so that it applies to a grounding version of physicalism, it would prove too much. While Russellian monism and physicalism are different, they have this in common (at least in their grounding versions): ordinary phenomenal properties are grounded in things that are not ordinary phenomenal properties. And this strongly suggests that, if the revelation argument were successful against physicalism, it would be equally successful against Russellian monism.

Third, revelation faces serious questions as a thesis about the phenomenal concept of (e.g.) pain. Consider the sense-datum theory, according to which, roughly, to be in pain is to be acquainted with a mental individual of a given type. Along with most contemporary philosophers, I think this theory is false. But that is not to deny that many extremely good philosophers held it at certain points in their career -- G.E. Moore, for example. Now, that Moore held a false view of the complete nature of pain makes it plausible that he failed to hold the true view of the complete nature of pain, whatever that is. After all, given how rational Moore was (not to mention how interested in mental states he was), it is unlikely that he simultaneously held two inconsistent theories of pain. But then, according to the thesis of revelation, Moore did not have the phenomenal concept of pain. But that is absurd. Whatever the phenomenal concept is exactly, Moore is as good a candidate as any to possess it; it is just that he did not know the complete nature of pain. Hence, to have the phenomenal concept of pain is not to know its complete nature.

For these reasons, I doubt the revelation argument provides a good reason to reject physicalism. But I don't doubt there are reasons to reject physicalism -- at any rate as Goff understands that (variously interpreted) doctrine.

For in fact, the version of physicalism at issue in the first part of this book is an extremely radical one. As Goff understands them, physical properties are entirely captured in logical/mathematical and nomic/causal terms (pp. 30-31). This entails that, if Goff's physicalism were true, we could in principle describe the world without remainder using a language whose non-logical and non-mathematical vocabulary was restricted to such expressions as 'causes' and 'it is a law that'; indeed, the totality of empirical knowledge could in principle be expressed in such a language. Independently of any view about consciousness, I find that incredible; and regardless of that, it is not the version of physicalism that is widely held in philosophy, as, indeed, Goff in effect points out later (pp. 141f).

There is much more to say about this version of physicalism, and why Goff focuses on it. But let's turn now to the second part, in which he is concerned with developing Russellian monism.

Russellian monism comes in different varieties, but Goff is most attracted to its panpsychist version. This view distinguishes two sorts of phenomenal properties. First are ordinary phenomenal properties, those associated with the consciousness of humans and other creatures, the ones we have been talking about so far. Second are extraordinary phenomenal properties, which are the non-structural properties that ground the structural properties that physics tells us about.

I think it is fair to say that this view faces a daunting set of difficulties. To begin with, it provokes what Goff, echoing Lewis, calls 'an incredulous stare' (p.253). For most of us, it is just unbelievable that things like electrons -- i.e. the bearers of fundamental structural properties -- are conscious in any way whatsoever. It might be replied (as indeed Lewis replied to his own incredulous stare) that the benefits of panpsychism outweigh its counter-intuitiveness. But unfortunately the literature on these matters, to which Goff himself has been a major contributor, runs in the other direction. The basic lesson of this literature is that panpsychism suffers numerous 'revenge' problems, i.e., problems that are counterparts of the problems that already face the physicalist and the dualist.

The most famous of these is the combination problem, which Goff introduces this way: "We feel we have some kind of grip on how . . . parts of a car engine make up an engine, but we are at a loss trying to make sense of lots of 'little' (proto) minds forming a big mind" (p. 165). Put differently, the combination problem strongly suggests that the relation between ordinary phenomenal properties and extraordinary ones if panpsychism is true is deeply analogous to the relation between ordinary phenomenal properties and physical ones if physicalism is true.

Goff provides an expert discussion of the combination problem and related problems in chapters 7-9. Simplifying somewhat, the main line of argument here, if I understand things correctly, consists of three main moves.

First, he argues that the most virulent form of the combination problem is (what he calls) the subject irreducibility problem, the key premise of which is that "what it is for there to be a conscious subject C cannot be analysed into facts not involving S" (p.209).

Second, he distinguishes 'micropsychist' and 'cosmopsychist' Russellian monism. The micropsychist holds that the bearers of the extraordinary phenomenal properties are very small, perhaps sub-atomic particles or small regions of space-time. The cosmopsychist holds instead that they are very big, the cosmos or universe itself.

Finally, he argues that, while the subject irreducibility problem presents an insuperable difficulty for micropsychism, the cosmospsychist has the resources to avoid it.

How can the cosmopsychist avoid the subject irreducibility problem? Goff distinguishes two ways to explicate grounding, the notion used to formulate both physicalism and Russellian monism: grounding by analysis and grounding by subsumption. X is grounded by analysis in Y if and only if (a) X is grounded in Y and (b) Y logically entails what is essentially required by X to be part of reality (p. 44-5, 216). In contrast, X is grounded by subsumption in Y if and only if (a) X is grounded in Y and (b) Y is a unity of which X is an aspect (p. 221). He suggests that condition (b) of grounding by subsumption can obtain even if condition (b) of grounding by analysis does not obtain; this yields a notion of grounding without analysis. He then argues that cosmopsychists may exploit this idea to answer the subject irreducibility problem, the idea being that what it is for S to be a conscious subject may be subsumed by facts not involving S -- e.g. facts about a conscious universe -- even if not analysed into such facts.

But there are several issues for this line of thought. For one thing, the examples that Goff discusses (pp.221-2) to motivate the idea of grounding without analysis do not do so. One such example is this: the fact that I have a total experience that includes an experience of red grounds the fact that I have an experience of red. Surely in that case the first fact logically entails what is essentially required for the second fact to be part of reality. For the first fact entails that I have an experience of red, which entails that that fact is a part of reality. A different example he uses is this: that the state of affairs a's being F exists grounds that a exists. Surely again, the first fact here logically entails the second.

Moreover, even if there are cases of grounding by subsumption that are not cases of grounding by analysis, there is reason for thinking this will not help the cosmopsychist. What is at issue in discussions of panpsychism generally (and physicalism generally) is not cases in which X grounds Y, for any X or Y; what is at issue rather is cases in which X grounds Y where X is the totality of fundamental facts, and Y is a non-fundamental fact taken arbitrarily. In such cases, it is common to assume, not simply that X grounds Y, but in addition that X a priori entails Y; indeed, Goff himself claims something like this when he says earlier (p. 129) that, "for any non-fundamental truth T, a transparent rendering of T is a priori entailed by a transparent rendering of the fundamental truths." Hence, on the assumption that if X a priori entails Y, X logically entails Y, it would appear that, in the relevant cases, grounding just is grounding by analysis.

How might Goff respond to the objection that the analysis/subsumption distinction is of no help to cosmopsychism? The most obvious suggestion is to distinguish a priori entailment and logical entailment: X a priori entails Y if and only if it is a priori that if X is true, Y is true; whereas X logically entails Y if and only if it is a logical truth that if X is true Y is true. However, while this difference exists, recognizing it makes Goff's defence of cosmopsychism weaker rather than stronger. For there are now not two but three notions of grounding: by analysis or logical entailment, by subsumption, and by a priori entailment. In addition, grounding by a priori entailment looks clearly to be the notion to focus on when considering any version of the combination problem, and hence any version of the subject irreducibility problem.

For these reasons, I also doubt that panpsychist Russellian monism -- in either its micro or cosmic versions -- is workable. Should we therefore give up Russellian monism? Not at all -- we should instead remind ourselves that Russellian monism need not be held in a panpsychist form!

When he first describes Russellian monism, Goff (p. 144) draws a distinction between the panpsychist version and what he calls, following David Chalmers, the panprotopsychist version. As we have seen, the panpsychist regards non-structural properties as themselves phenomenal properties, but of a rather unusual sort. The panprotopsychist holds instead that the nature of these properties is unknown, which of course is consistent with their being non-phenomenal.

I think the label 'panprotopsychist' is misleading. It suggests some deep affinity between panprotopsychism and panpsychism. But there need be no such affinity. One way to see this is to notice that many versions of physicalism may also be described as 'panprotopsychist', as Goff understands that phrase. For they too entail that the fundamental elements of the world are or contain "crucial ingredients . . . that explain consciousness" (p. 144).

Regardless of what it is called, panprotopsychist Russellian monism evades the problems we have been looking at. It does not face the conceivability argument or knowledge argument, since those arguments presuppose that we have a full grip on the relevant facts, at least in outline, which is something this position denies. It does not face the combination problem, since it does not say that ordinary phenomenal properties are grounded in extraordinary ones. And while it might face the revelation argument if that argument were persuasive, as we have seen, there is a serious question about whether it is persuasive in the first place.

Isn't this then precisely the version of Russellian monism that is most plausible? That's what I think, but Goff gives two arguments for the opposite view.

First, he says that panpsychism is simpler than panprotopsychism:

All we get from physics is this big black and white abstract structure, which we metaphysicians must somehow color in with concrete categorical nature. Assuming the falsity of substance dualism, we know how to color in one bit of it: the brains of organisms are colored in with consciousness. How to color in the rest? The most elegant, simple, sensible option is to color in the rest of the world with the same pen. (p. 171)

But it is hard to detect the force in this line of reasoning. Panprotopsychists will reply that the brains of organisms are not colored in with consciousness; rather they are colored in with something unknown that partially grounds consciousness -- an entirely different matter. And anyway, that theory A is simpler than theory B is not a good reason to prefer A to B if A (and not B) is known to be in trouble on other grounds.

Second, he says that panprotopsychist Russellian monism raises "the threat of noumenalism," the idea being that this version of the view leaves it unknown, and perhaps unknowable, what the ultimate nature of the world is. Now, at several points in this book, a limited role for a suggestion like this is acknowledged; in fact, Goff appeals to it often to deal with various versions of the combination problem (see, e.g., p.181, p. 185). But in general, noumenalism is a bridge too far for cosmopsychist Goff. The whole point for him is to give a positive account of fundamental reality (hence the name of the book). Physicalism and dualism in their standard forms do attempt to provide such an account, as does panpsychism. But panprotopsychism does not, and that is why he finds it unattractive.

I think here we are close to the heart of the matter. For there seems to be a conflation in Goff -- and, I would argue, in others -- of two different philosophical tasks. The first task, a philosophy of mind task, is to say something sensible about consciousness and its relation to the rest of nature, something that avoids the problems of traditional physicalism and dualism. The second task, a task in speculative metaphysics, is to provide a specific, positive and complete account (not simply an abstract, negative or partial account) of fundamental reality -- a world-view, to put it in other terminology.

The first task seems to me to be achievable. Indeed, while I don't like the label, and would dispute a lot of the details, I think panprotopsychist Russellian monism, or something near enough, has achieved it; at least it represents our best chance of doing so.

But the second task is, in my view, unachievable. Here I sit in the School of Philosophy, Australian National University, Coombs Building, Room 2207. Someone asks: 'What is your specific, positive and complete theory of fundamental reality?' What, in all seriousness, am I supposed to say? I realize, of course, that adherents to the main positions of philosophy of mind -- not just traditional physicalism and dualism, but panpsychism too -- take themselves to have provided answers to that question. But so what? We know those answers are problematic, and one of the main points about Russellian monism is that it moves us beyond them.

In sum, the situation seems to me to be this. Russellian monism in its most plausible form -- that is, in its misnamed 'panprotopsychist' form -- violates some well-entrenched expectations about what a contribution to this part of philosophy should look like. But that shows us more about those expectations than it does about Russellian monism. It is a benefit of Goff's excellent book that it makes us see this even more clearly than we did before.


 Thanks to David Chalmers, Philip Goff, Erick Llamas, and Don Nordblom for very helpful comments on previous drafts of this review.