Consciousness and Its Objects

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Colin McGinn, Consciousness and Its Objects, Oxford University Press, 2004, 264pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 019926760X

Reviewed by Daniel Stoljar, Australian National University


McGinn's new book gathers together his essays on consciousness from about the last ten years, as well as a number of other essays written expressly for the purpose. It is, he says, a sequel to his earlier The Problem of Consciousness (Basil Blackwell, Oxford, 1991) and certainly the themes here deepen and extend the position familiar from that book: the mysterian view--as it has come to be known--that the limits of human knowledge have an impact on the problem of consciousness, and indeed on a lot of other problems besides. The essays exhibit the features with which readers of McGinn's work will be familiar: the clarity and relaxedness of his writing, the imagination, the tenacity in following arguments to their conclusion. Overall, the collection is both intellectually substantial and fun to read--very impressive.

Here is how things are organized. Chapters 1-3 are essays directly on the problem of consciousness. Chapter 1 offers a diagnosis of the source of the problem, suggesting it arises because of a certain conceptual fact, namely that one cannot have the concept of experience without being acquainted--in some sense--with experience. Chapter 2 argues against those who appeal to the necessary a posteriori in responding to the problem of consciousness. Here McGinn advances a version of the property dualism argument familiar in particular from Stephen White's paper "Curse of the Qualia" (Synthese 68:1986: 333-68). In Chapter 3 McGinn reminds us that, in his well-known article "Can we solve the mind-body problem?"--the central paper of the 1991 book--his answer to the title-question is 'yes and no'--'yes' to the philosophical problem, 'no' to the empirical question. Chapters 4-6 focus more on the notion of matter. Chapter 4 suggests that, in view of the nature of identity, if pain is subjective then so to is the firing of c-fibers, if pain = c-fibers firing. Chapter 5 discusses the relation of consciousness to space, suggesting that any sort of reductionism about consciousness must involve a new conception of space. Chapter 6 is an interesting discussion of atomism, in which McGinn casts himself as a modern-day Democritus, conjecturing that (mental) atomism is true in advance of having any specific evidence for it. Chapters 7-10 are bit miscellaneous. Chapter 7 is a dialogue between two world-views, McGinn's and an alternative whose leading idea is that the brain acts as sort of transmitter between a world of matter and a world of spirit. Chapter 8 offers a brief statement of McGinn's views about philosophical problems; in effect the chapter is a précis of his 1993 book, Problems in Philosophy: The Limits of Enquiry (Oxford, 1993). Chapter 9 argues against various first-person-authority theses. As McGinn notes, the basic argument of this chapter is inconsistent with that of chapter 1, an inconsistency he then struggles to resolve. Finally, chapter 10 takes up the analysis of perception. McGinn states his position here by saying that, according to it, there are non-existent objects. This sounds a bit startling, but as McGinn himself points out, all that is really intended is that there are true perceptual reports of the form 's perceives o' wherein 'o' does not refer; that is, 's perceives o' should be thought of as similar to 's is thinking of o'. Whether this latter idea is helpfully summarized in the slogan 'there are non-existent objects' seems to me open to question.

With so many themes covered there is much to discuss. Still, reading the book and thinking through the issues for my own purposes, I was continually struck by the following simple objection to McGinn's mysterianism--an objection that unfortunately does not seem to me to be discussed in any explicit way in his work. The objection is, roughly, that, while the claim of ignorance is in the context true (or at any rate plausible), it is also irrelevant. "Of course we might be ignorant of many things, and perhaps even chronically so", the critic will say, "but this has no effect on such first-base philosophical questions as 'what, if anything, is wrong with the conceivability argument against materialism?' For these arguments can be stated in such a way that the fact of ignorance--assuming it to be a fact--can be abstracted away from for the purposes of discussion."

Why is it that the fact of ignorance can be abstracted away from? "We might be ignorant of many things" the critic will continue "but at least we know that the truths, concepts, facts (etc.) of which we are ignorant are, if non-experiential or physical, then (e.g.) objective. But an argument that has the persuasive force of the conceivability argument can be formulated about the relation between the experiential and the unknown objective, just as much as between the experiential and the known objective, for the contrast that lies at the heart of the problem is that between the experiential and the objective." Another way to make the point is this. Imagine I am trying to convince you that numbers are colored. When you point out to me that numbers don't seem to be the sort of things that are colored, it is no good my saying that there are or might be numbers of which we are ignorant. Unknown numbers are still numbers after all; hence our ignorance of some numbers is irrelevant to the assessment of my position.

Of course the proponent of this objection is not saying that the conceivability argument is sound; perhaps it is not. The objection is open as much to the analytic functionalist as to the dualist. But what the objection shows, if successful, is that, any appeal to ignorance is irrelevant to the philosophical issues raised by the argument. Hence, to the extent that our interest is in the evaluation of the conceivability argument (and similar arguments such as the knowledge argument and the explanatory-gap argument), we may as well operate as if all the facts are in. To put it another way, mysterianism does not have the effect McGinn says it will, viz., change our thinking about consciousness in such a way that we will no longer feel the pull of (what he calls) the DIME structure, i.e. the tendency to adopt one of a deflationist reductionist option, an outright irreducibility option, an eerily magical option, or an ontological elimination option. If the objection I just stated is sound, consciousness is a dime-store mystery after all.

How to respond? I see four main possibilities, but none of them sits comfortably with McGinn's overall position.

The first is to adopt what I will call anti-naturalist mysterianism (AM). The anti-naturalist mysterian responds to the argument above by conceding it and conceding that experiences are not reducible to anything else--that is what makes it anti-naturalist. But AM retains an element of mysterianism in that the precise relation between the physical and irreducible experiences eludes us. AM seems to me to be the leading idea in the post-The View from Nowhere (OUP, 1986) Nagel, as well as in Jackson's brief discussion of mysterianism in his 'Epiphenomenal Qualia' (Philosophical Quarterly, 32: 127-36), which McGinn refers to here on p 12. But NM cannot be McGinn's view, and the reason is precisely his naturalism. Naturalism means all things to all people, but in this context it means that experiences are not irreducible. McGinn is resolutely opposed to irreducibilty--as his opposition to the dime-shape makes clear--and so AM is not his view.

The next possibility is to adopt what I will call revisionist mysterianism (RM). The revisionist mysterian responds to the argument by conceding that it is right--so long as one adopts the standard interpretation of objectivity. But--the revisionist continues--there might be a new and different understanding of objectivity according to which the argument fails. The element of mysterianism remains insofar as we are ignorant of what this alternative conception might be. McGinn himself seems to suggest RM when he says (p.91) "maybe mental states are reducible to something that does not have the marks of full-blown objectivity". But on reflection it is as difficult to attribute RM to McGinn as AM. The problem this time is that RM does not differ from a standard form of eliminativism or reductionism. It is a commonplace that reductions might involve the reassessment and re-interpretation of the concepts involved. So at this point the mysterianism seems not to be an alternative to the dime shape.

The third possibility is to adopt what I will call transcendental mysterianism (TM), according to which there is a third sort of fact or truth, neither subjective nor objective. Now, in the sense that is at issue in these discussions, an objective truth or fact is one that can be understood from more than one point of view, and a subjective truth or fact is one that can be understood from only one point of view. Given this, the only way in which a truth can be neither objective nor subjective is if it cannot be understood at all. So the suggestion of transcendental mysterianism is that the objection I stated fails because that there are truths that cannot be known even in principle and that these entail both the truths that are objective and those that are subjective. Is TM McGinn's view? Well, again there are passages which suggest it; for example in the sentence following the one quoted in the previous paragraph he says "maybe new properties could be discovered which reduce mental states and are not themselves objective" (p.91). But again it is difficult to attribute TM to McGinn. The reason this time is that the overall impression one gets from his writing is not that the truths in question could not be understood at all but that they may be--to use his own word--discovered. But such a discovery is ruled out by TM--that is what makes it transcendental. In fact, this is also what makes it controversial, for it is far from clear that there are any of the truths that the transcendental mysterian says there are. Of course there are truths that cannot be understood by someone or other. But are there truths that cannot be understood period?

The final possibility is to adopt what I will call deflationist mysterianism (DM). According to this view, the premise of the objection above is false in this sense: it is not the case that the problem will re-emerge whenever you contrast the experiential with the objective. The guiding thought is that the source of the problem is epistemic rather than conceptual; hence, once the ignorance is taken away, so too is the problem. However, DM is not going to appeal to McGinn either. As we have seen, in his first chapter, he suggests that the source of the problem is conceptual, and throughout he insists that consciousness is subjective and not objective. Hence, while McGinn's view is in a sense deflationary, as he says (e.g, p. 70), it is not deflationary in this sense. In fact, this is the really strange thing about McGinn's position. You would think that someone who emphasises ignorance in the way that McGinn does would think that the source of the philosophical problem of conciousness is ignorance. But this is not his view.

In sum, when faced with the 'plausible but irrelevant' objection McGinn faces a series of unappealing options. As I read him, he wants to advance a version of mysterianism that is naturalistic, non-transcendental, non-deflationary (in the sense described) and yet is an alternative to the dime-shape. But it is not clear there is any form of mysterianism.

None of this is to say, of course, that positions similar to McGinn's are mistaken. On the contrary, I for one am quite convinced by him (and by such others as Jackson, Chomsky, Nagel and Russell) that the resolution of the philosophical problem of consciousness does indeed lie in some sense in our ignorance. The hard part is taking this rather vague idea and turning it into a detailed and compelling response to the problem of consciousness. McGinn has done much in this regard, but there is much else to do.