Consciousness and Its Place in Nature: Does Physicalism Entail Panpsychism?

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Galen Strawson et al., Consciousness and Its Place in Nature: Does Physicalism Entail Panpsychism? (ed. Anthony Freeman), Imprint Academic, 2006, 285pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 1845400593.

Reviewed by Leopold Stubenberg, University of Notre Dame


This volume originated as a special issue of the Journal for Consciousness Studies (Volume 13, Numbers 10-11, 2006). Galen Strawson provides the lead article: "Realistic Monism: Why Physicalism Entails Panpsychism." ("RM" for short, 3-31) There follow seventeen commentaries, ranging in length from 3 to 18 pages, by an impressive group of authors: Peter Carruthers & Elizabeth Schechter, Sam Coleman, Philip Goff, Frank Jackson, William Lycan, Fiona Macpherson, Colin McGinn, David Papineau, Georges Rey, David Rosenthal, William Seager, Peter Simons, David Skrbina, J.J.C. Smart, H.P. Stapp, Daniel Stoljar, and Catherine Wilson. (32-183) Strawson's lengthy reply -- "Panpsychism? Reply to Commentators with a Celebration of Descartes" -- makes up the final section of the book. ("PR" for short, 184-280). A detailed table of contents can be found here:

In RM Strawson argues that a real or realistic materialist/physicalist, i.e., one who takes consciousness seriously, must adopt panpsychism. Reductive accounts of consciousness -- of which there are many -- all boil down to different versions of eliminativism. And the hope that the world of matter (as traditionally understood) can accommodate (unreduced) consciousness by way of the latter's emerging out of the former, is vain. For such an emergence is an unintelligible, magical process. Since neither eliminativism about consciousness nor magic is acceptable, the two main rivals of panpsychism -- reduction and emergence -- are unavailable, and the materialist who is serious about consciousness has no choice but to embrace panpsychism.

Physicalism (or materialism -- Strawson uses these terms interchangeably, PR fn. 5) is "the view that every real, concrete phenomenon in the universe is… physical." (3) Consciousness, or phenomenology, or feeling, or sensation, or experiential 'what-it's-likeness,' or experience (Strawson's preferred term) is "the fundamental given natural fact" and "nothing is more certain than the existence of experience." (4) Panpsychism -- "the view that the existence of every real concrete thing involves experiential being even if it also involves non-experiential being" (8) -- has few friends in contemporary philosophy. For many feel (and some will say) that it is "a complete myth, a comfortable piece of utter balderdash." (McGinn 93) But Strawson thinks that this resistance to panpsychism is grounded on a mistake, viz., the belief "that the experiential and the physical are utterly and irreconcilably different." (5) We have, he tells us, "no good reason to think that we know anything about the physical that gives us any reason to find any problem in the idea that experiential phenomena are physical phenomena." (4)

The inscrutability of matter is the key to Strawson's panpsychism. Following Eddington, Russell, and many others, he holds that science only tells us about abstract, structural features of matter. This sort of information does, in Russell's words, "not suffice to show whether the physical world is, or is not, different in intrinsic character from the world of mind." (10) And Eddington puts it even more succinctly: "science has nothing to say about the intrinsic nature of the atom." (10) But science is not our only source of knowledge about matter. Being conscious, having experiences, is another. For, according to the physicalist, matter, configured brain-wise, "regularly constitutes -- is, literally is -- experience like ours." (9) Thus in experience the intrinsic nature of (at least some) matter stands revealed. It follows "that there is a lot more to neurons than physics and neurophysiology record (or can record)." (7) To deny this is to go eliminativist about experience and simply crazy. (cf. 7)

How does one get from "there is more to neurons than… " to "everything is experience involving"? First, by being strict about emergence:

If it really is true that Y is emergent from X then it must be the case that Y is in some sense wholly dependent on X and X alone, so that all features of Y trace intelligibly back to X (where 'intelligible' is a metaphysical rather than an epistemic notion). (18)

Emergence that does not live up to this standard is brute -- but "emergence can't be brute." (18). In the case of experience there is nothing "about the nature of the emerged-from [nonexperiential reality] in virtue of which the emerger [experience] emerges as it does and is what it is." (15) It follows that consciousness cannot emerge from brains composed of matter as it is ordinarily conceived. But it does. Therefore the matter composing brains must be extraordinary -- it must have an experiential aspect. That is, the ultimate particles that make up brains cannot be wholly unconscious. In short, "real physicalists must accept that at least some ultimates are intrinsically experience-involving. They must at least embrace micropsychism." (25) But it is hard to stop at micropsychism. It entails a radical and completely arbitrary bifurcation of ultimates into experiential and nonexperiential ones. Hence panpsychism is the much more reasonable position. This is the short second step that takes one from "there is more to neurons than… " to "everything is experience involving."

So much for the central idea of RM. But there is much more in the paper. In what follows I'll briefly mention some of these issues. Strawson deals with a number of attempts to resist the panpsychist conclusion. Those who want to stop the descent into panpsychism by maintaining that experience is a mere appearance -- there is no real seeming, there only seems to be, as Dennett would say -- have it all wrong. Because "for there to seem to be rich phenomenology or experience just is for there to be such phenomenology or experience." (6, cf. 17, 23) Those who want to soften the blow of panpsychism by maintaining that all we get at the bottom is proto-experience, not experience proper, also have it all wrong. Either proto-experience is experience, in which case you are back at panpsychism, or it is not, in which case we are back to the "magic passage across the experiential/non-experiential divide." (24) And those who want to rise above the old experiential/non-experiential controversy by adopting neutral monism have it all wrong too. A mental state, constructed out of neutral elements, either has or lacks genuine experiential features. If it has them, then they either emerged from the non-experiential base, and a miracle occurred; or experience was already present in the "neutral" base, and we are back at panpsychism (with a misleading name). And if it is said that the constructed mental state merely appears to have genuine experiential features but does not really have them, the reply is the same as the one given above: "experience -- appearance, if you like -- cannot itself be only appearance, i.e. not really real, because there must be experience for there to be appearance." (23)

Strawson also acknowledges a number of difficulties facing his position. He notes, for example, that emergence of macroexperientiality from microexperientiality, while not a miracle, is still quite puzzling. A related issue concerns the unity of consciousness -- how can many microexperiences constitute or compose a macroexperience? This problem is especially difficult for Strawson because he insists that every experience, be it macro or micro, is owned by a subject. That makes for very many and, presumably, very alien subjects. How can their experiences make up yours? A third issue that Strawson flags is that of mental causation. A fourth issue, that may be on the minds of many of his readers -- what are the microexperiences of the ultimate particles like? -- Strawson mentions, but brushes aside: "there is no more difficulty in the idea that the experiential quality of microexperientiality is unimaginable by us than there is in the idea that there may exist sensory modalities (qualitatively) unimaginable to us." (27)

The reader of RM may think that Strawson's real physicalism suffers from a much more glaring problem: it simply isn't physicalism at all. For it may seem obvious that any theory that entails panpsychism, or any theory that results from combining anything whatever with panpsychism, is incompatible with the materialist spirit. Most of Strawson's readers are apt to think so, for they probably agree with Thomas Nagel that "panpsychism is…  dualism all the way down."[1] Strawson is well aware of this problem and offers an abundance of not so catchy replacement labels: "experiential-and-nonexperiential monism," "experiential-and-nonexperiential ?-ism," "?-ism," and, finally, "realistic monism" -- the term that makes it into the title of the target paper. This may all sound a little frivolous, but there is a serious thought here. Strawson explains his use of the word "physical" as follows: "I take the word 'physical' to be a natural-kind term whose reference I can sufficiently indicate by drawing attention to tables and chairs and -- as a realistic physicalist -- experiential phenomena." (8) If you are a materialist and take experience seriously, then you will count all the concrete phenomena you can point to -- be they experiential or non-experiential -- as physical. Accordingly, panpsychism, the doctrine that every "real concrete thing involves experiential being," (8) has nothing to do with dualism, and the air of paradox vanishes. But Strawson does acknowledge that his way of using the term "physical" comes at a cost. Given his use of the term, the claim that every concrete thing is physical is trivially true. But given a more traditional use of the term, this claim is a bold and controversial thesis. Based on this consideration, Strawson ends his discussion of this issue by saying "anyone who prefers to call my position 'realistic monism' instead of 'real physicalism' should feel free to do so." (8-9)

Two of the seventeen commentaries are authored by panpsychists. Skrbina, whose recent Panpsychism in the West (Cambridge: MIT Press 2005) is the big book on the topic, celebrates RM as a breakthrough. But Coleman, a self-identified panexperientialist, is quite critical -- as are the commentaries by the remaining sixteen authors. United in rejecting panpsychism, these critics are divided by their attitude toward the doctrine: some find it utterly bizarre; others are fascinated; but all have interesting things to say about it. Here are some of the many points raised in the commentaries.

The objections in the first group are directed against Strawson's argument for panpsychism. One of Strawson's central assumptions is that the experiential cannot be reduced to the nonexperiential. Those who put forth such reductions -- Strawson mentions Daniel Dennett, Fred Dretske, Michael Tye, and two of our commentators, Lycan and Rey -- are really just eliminativists. (5, fn. 6) Rey happily owns up to this accusation. (113-4) But Lycan emphatically does not. (66) He, plus about six other commentators (probably more), hold that the experiential can be reduced to the nonexperiential. And a good number of them -- Carruthers, Jackson, Lycan, Papineau, Rey (?), Rosenthal, and Smart seem to fall into this class -- might support this claim by pointing out that the experiential has been so reduced -- by themselves, as it happens. When they ask Strawson what their account leaves out, he replies with the famous line: "If you gotta ask, you ain't never gonna get to know." (5, fn. 6) Stapp's take on the irreducibility assumption is a little different. While he seems to agree that the experiential cannot be reduced to the nonexperiential, he insists that there is no tension between the experiential and current physics. The point seems to be that experience need not be reduced to physics, because experience is already an indispensable element of contemporary physics. But if experience is a basic factor in the physical description of the world, the views of Stapp and Strawson may not be that far apart after all. This impression is strengthened by the fact that Stapp acknowledges that his view might be classified as a form of idealism. (168)

The second central assumption of Strawson's argument for panpsychism is non-emergence: the experiential cannot emerge out of the nonexperiential. The impossibility in question is supposed to be metaphysical, not merely epistemological. But one reply, more prominent in the literature than in the present set of commentaries, states that the impression of impossibility can be fully accounted for by noting certain peculiarities of our phenomenal concepts. Hence our inability to see how the experiential might emerge out of the nonexperiential does not suggest that this is really impossible. Carruthers & Schechter (34-5) and Coleman (45) briefly discuss this reply. But none of the commentators develop it in detail.

Another response proceeds by setting aside the question whether the assumption of non-emergence is true -- instead it is claimed that the materialist can do without the emergence assumption. Rather than saying that the experiential emerges from the non-experiential "in the relevant sense" (63), one might, according to Jackson, hold that "there are fundamental laws of nature that go from certain complex arrangements of the non-conscious to consciousness." (63-4) Such laws would, Jackson appears to think, provide a non-emergentist account of the generation of consciousness. But one wonders whether this amounts to anything more than an endorsement of brute emergence. For by making the laws fundamental, Jackson indicates that there is nothing more to be said about the mechanism that gives rise to  consciousness. Macpherson and McGinn also try to avoid emergence, but along a rather different path. After raising the question why we must assume that experience emerges from anything, Macpherson asks:

Why not suppose that the property of having an experience… is a fundamental property… Why must the experiential property I have when I see something red emerge from other more fundamental properties?… One could hold that that property is not reducible to, or does not emerge from, other properties -- experiential or non-experiential. One could hold that that property can attach to bundles of other properties to create creatures with experience. (85-6)

And McGinn drives home the same point when he says that

you might hold that experience is a fundamental feature of the universe, not emerging from anything else, as basic as space and time, that just becomes attached to brains when they reach the right level of complexity, and at the same time insist, like Galen, that experiences 'just are' physical. (92-3)

Macpherson and McGinn reject an assumption Strawson makes in RM, an assumption to which Coleman usefully draws our attention by naming it smallism. It is "the view that all facts are determined by the facts about the smallest things, those existing at the lowest 'level' of ontology." (40) As Strawson will tell us in PR, smallism is an assumption that he feels entitled to, for it is shared by those materialists to whom his argument is addressed.

A final objection to the non-emergence assumption is rooted in an observation that Strawson himself emphasizes: our ignorance of the nature of the physical. Rosenthal puts it this way: "Since we don't now know the laws that govern the occurrence of conscious experiences, we cannot see at present how the experiential might emerge from the neurophysiological." (121) And he suggests that once these laws are known, the emergence of experience from the non-experiential may come to seem no stranger than the emergence of liquidity from a group of water molecules. (121) Simons thinks that "the most sane and sober conclusion is that we simply do not know enough to see how experience emerges from the non-experiential." (148) He emphasizes how hard the problem is and concludes that it would be "presumptuous to suppose that because we are currently unable to see how the emergence might work, that there can be no natural emergence." (148) And Wilson agrees with the authors of Objections VI to Descartes's Meditations who argue as follows:

Since we do not know what can be done by bodies and their motions, and since you confess that without a divine revelation no one can know everything which God has  imparted… how can you possibly have known that God has not implanted in certain bodies a power or property enabling them to doubt, think, etc? (178)

So the point is not exactly new, but none the worse for that. Stoljar is the one who makes the most of this consideration. He alleges that Strawson's position is incoherent: "part of Strawson's overall account entails he is ignorant of non-experiential facts" -- the part that insists that matter is only known with respect to its structural features and not known at all intrinsically -- "another part entails he is not" (176) -- the part that insists that nonexperiential stuff could not possibly give rise to experience of any kind. Both of these parts play an essential role in Strawson's argument; but they can be combined only on pain of contradiction.

A third line of attack on Strawson's argument for panpsychism targets the Russell/Eddington inspired assumption that matter, only known to us in its relational properties, must have intrinsic properties to ground these relations. Lycan remains completely unmoved: "Perhaps the nature of a subatomic particle is exhausted by the totality of its relations to other things." (67) For good measure he adds that if intrinsic properties were needed, the reason for thinking that experiential properties might fill the bill is weak. And he tops this off by claiming that if such properties were needed, and if there were reason to think that our experiential properties provide the "stuffing for matter" (David Armstrong's evocative term), defeat would still be assured. For experiential properties, as he has argued in numerous books, are themselves relational. It would appear, then, that Lycan is not impressed. Nor is Rosenthal. Physics, he assures us, gives us more than merely structural or mathematical knowledge of the physical. He lists mass, spin, and charge (123) as possible candidates. The most sustained discussion of this issue is to be found in Seager's illuminating paper. He first proposes a metaphysical framework that can underwrite the claim that matter must have intrinsic properties. The core idea is the Principle of the Reducibility of Relations: "All extrinsic properties are determined by intrinsic properties" (131) which he traces back to Leibniz and Bradley. He then argues that "if we couple the idea that physics provides us insight only into relational properties of matter with the (appropriate form of the) reduction principle, we are forced to postulate an intrinsic ground for the relational, structural or mathematical properties." (135) After carefully reconstructing Strawson's argument on this basis, he goes on to consider relationalism -- the view which "asserts that all there is to matter is the set of inter-relationships which science reveals" (138) -- and concludes that Strawson's argument falls apart if relationalism is adopted. He ends the paper with a list of six difficulties for relationalism. The point of Seager's paper is not to take sides, but to clarify what is involved in a crucial move of Strawson's argument for panpsychism.

The objections in the first group were directed at the argument for panpsychism; those of the second group are directed at panpsychism itself. They mainly focus on three areas: the nature and knowability of the microexperiential; the nature and knowability of the macroexperiential; the relationship between the micro- and the macroexperiential.

Lycan (70) and McGinn (95) ask the obvious question: do we have any idea what the experiences of the ultimate particles are or could be like? Do we have to ascribe full-featured experiences to them if we eschew the "weaselly line" (McGinn 95) of attributing mere proto-experiences to them? And if that is so, what are our big brains for? (McGinn 97) And is there any reason to believe that we (macrosubjects) could ever get to know the mental properties of the microsubjects that constitute us? (Carruthers and Schechter 36-7) In addition to these questions about the qualitative content of microexperience, there are questions concerning the subject of these experiences. Coleman (the panexperientialist) boldly proposes to "ditch the thesis about subjects. If experience must permeate the lowest level, let us deny that mere experience suffices to subjecthood." (49) Aside from bringing down the number of subjects to more reasonable numbers, this move also allows Coleman to sidestep the obvious problem that "putting little subjects together doesn't give a big subject." (49)

A number of commentators doubt that we have a fully transparent grasp of our own (macro)experience. (Papineau 102; Rey 112) More importantly, they argue that such a transparent grasp

is sharply in tension, if not inconsistent, with my conscious experience turning out to be, in and of itself, quite different from how it appears to be in introspection: i.e. turning out to be constituted of the experiential being of billions of micro subjects of experience." (Goff 57, see also Papineau 107)

This raises at least two questions (in addition to the one just raised by Coleman: how can many little subjects add up to a big one?). First, why are we not aware of the complex structure or grain of our macroexperiences? Second, how can the combination of many microexperiences of one kind give rise to a macroexperience of another kind? (See Goff 57-59)

These questions take us into the third area of concern: how are the microexperiential and the macroexperiential related? The difficulty is raised explicitly in at least five commentaries. Carruthers and Schechter argue that the microexperiential and the macroexperiential are separated by an explanatory gap. (38, 39) Goff claims that the emergence of the macroexperiential from the microexperiential "is a kind of brute emergence which is arguably just as unintelligible as the emergence of the experiential from the nonexperiential." (53) And Lycan (69), McGinn (96), and Papineau (107) make similar observations. These considerations pose the most serious threat to panpsychism. If panpsychism cannot explain the presence of macroexperience in the world then there no longer is any reason why the realistic physicalist should adopt it. If these critics are right, then panpsychism is not the only way of making sense of the existence of experience in the material world -- for if there really is this gulf between micro- and macroexperience, then the existence of macroexperience remains a mystery.

"Dualism all the way down" is what many commentators seem to see when looking at Strawson's realistic physicalism. McGinn states the problem in a pleasingly blunt way: "He simply wants to call experiences physical -- just as I may want to call ocean waves spiritual. The complaint in both cases is that very different things have been brought together under the same label, in flagrant violation of common usage." (91) And he ends this discussion as follows: "By his methods we could extend the reach of physicalism still further, by declaring that 'physical' is a natural kind term for such things as bodies, minds and numbers!" (92) Coleman (44), Rey (110), and Smart (160) also make the dualism charge. But Macpherson makes the point most carefully and most forcefully and ends up concluding that "this view, in standard terminology, is one of substance monism together with property dualism." (79)

Strawson ends RM with the suggestion that a deeper understanding of his panpsychist framework requires one to confront a number of issues in general metaphysics:

The object/process/property/state/event cluster of distinctions… is hopelessly superficial from the point of view of science and metaphysics… One needs a vivid sense of the respect in which… every object is a process; one needs to abandon the idea that there is any sharp or categorial distinction between an object and its propertiedness. One needs to grasp fully the point that 'property dualism'… is strictly incoherent… insofar as it purports to be genuinely distinct from substance dualism… discursive thought is not adequate to the nature of reality…  (28)

PR is a long (nearly 100 pages) and complex (41 numbered metaphysical and epistemological theses are stated and discussed) essay in which Strawson tries to (i) address some of these metaphysical questions and attempts to show that (ii) this metaphysically clarified version of panpsychism can withstand the objections raised by his commentators. Here I can only touch on some of the central themes of PR while leaving aside most of the details.

Strawson refuses to accept Coleman's proposal to "ditch the subject." (49) But Strawson's subjects turn out to be thin -- so thin, in fact, that one has to fear for their existence. Subjects of experience are momentary beings (cf. 192) that are indistinguishable from their experiences, from the experiencing. (cf. 193) Stated more explicitly, a subject of experience "is at the same time an experience, an experiencing, i.e. literally identical with an experience or experiencing." (247)

Strawson knows that such talk must spook his readers. So he tries to clarify the matter by embedding this view about the subject of experience into a larger view about the relationship between objects and their properties. It's a mistake to think that there is a sharp distinction between the two. For "plainly objects without properties are impossible" (194) and "why accept properties without objects after having rejected objects without properties?" (195) The resulting view "is not that there can be concrete instantiations of properties without concrete objects. It is that the best [thought still inadequate] thing to say, given our existing terms, is that objects are (just) concrete instantiations of properties." (195) Strawson is aware that this explanation may not have dispelled all anxieties occasioned by his metaphysical disclosures; but he remains unfazed: "the standard existing categories of object, substance and property are not adequate to the nature of reality. The sense of intolerable peculiarity is not an objection to this claim, but evidence of its truth." (195) What Strawson seems to propose, in short, is that we adopt a new categorial framework. Such far-reaching changes are not achieved overnight. Here are Strawson's reflections on this issue:

This is another of those points at which philosophy requires a form of contemplation, something more than theoretical assent: cultivation of a shift in intuitions, acquisition of the ability to sustain a different continuo in place in the background of thought, at least for a time. (198)

That sort of thing takes time -- Strawson suggests that it may take two years for one to feel fully at home in the new framework. (cf. 197-8) Though this may well be true, it makes it virtually impossible for a newcomer to properly assess the view. One finds oneself at sea, having been robbed of all traditional conceptual moorings. And once one sees how great the difficulties are to which the new framework gives rise, one may no longer feel any inclination to make Strawson's vision one's own.[2]

In the course of the reexamination of the original doctrine --  "all physical stuff is… an experience involving phenomenon" (25, 189) -- Strawson is led to surrender the term "physical". (234) So the fundamental contrast is no longer the physical/experiential contrast but the non-experiential/experiential contrast. Given the decision to start with the experiential/non-experiential distinction, the datum -- called the Fundamental Duality Thesis -- from which Strawson starts is this: there is experiential as well as non-experiential reality. (cf. 231) The problem is this: "Is the Fundamental Duality Thesis combinable with a generally monist position?" (231) The switch from the physical to the non-experiential makes this problem so hard. Strawson was confident that the wholly physical could be experiential. But the suggestions that the wholly non-experiential might be experiential, and that the experiential might be wholly non-experiential strike him as necessarily false. (cf. 230-1) If all there is is experiential and non-experiential reality, and they are mutually exclusive, then there appears to be no possibility of arriving at the Fundamental-Duality Monism.

Philosophers who still operate with the traditional substance/property metaphysics may fail to see the problem. The popular combination of substance monism with property dualism may seem to deliver just what is needed: a monism that respects the Fundamental-Duality Thesis by allowing for the existence of two fundamentally different kinds of properties. But, according to Strawson, this position is incoherent. For there is

no real distinction between a substance and its properties. So if there are two fundamental properties neither of which can in any sense be the other… then there must be two substances: for there is no real distinction between substances and their properties. (239)

 This shows that Strawson's metaphysical revisionism comes at a high price -- he has to find a new way of making room for the fundamental duality within a monistic framework. And if that should prove impossible, monism can only be retained at the cost of denying the existence of non-experiential reality.

But Strawson is not ready to give up yet. He thinks "that the non-experiential can be retained only if it is literally identical with the experiential in some Spinozan way." He does, however, immediately acknowledge that the chances of success are slim: "if that is as impossible as it sounds, then it is impossible." (229) The Spinozistical version of Fundamental-Duality Monism that Strawson considers amounts to this:

Reality is substantially single. All reality is experiential and all reality is non-experiential. Experiential and non-experiential being exist in such a way that neither can be said to be based in or realized by or in any way asymmetrically dependent on the other…  (241)

To embrace this form of monism is to accept that the experiential is identical to the non-experiential and that, Strawson acknowledges, is something that many judge to be incoherent "on the grounds that it involves abandoning the law of non-contradiction." (246) But Strawson, never one to follow a multitude, ends his discussion of the Spinozistical version of Fundamental-Duality Monism with this confession: "For my part, I am fond of [Spinozistical] monism. I think it may very well be a truth beyond our understanding, and I am not prepared to dismiss it in this way." (246)

Those monists who cannot bring themselves to embrace the Spinozistical version of Fundamental-Duality Monism are faced with an alternative: accept radical eliminativism or pure panpsychism. (cf. 241, 246) Strawson is, to put it mildly, no fan of eliminativism. (cf. 5-6) That leaves pure panpsychism. It is the view that "all being is experiential being." (227) I.e., there is no non-experiential being; there is only experiential being. The case for pure panpsychism is simple and powerful (cf. 235):

[i]            There is only one fundamental kind of reality [basic assumption]

[ii]            There is reality of the experiential fundamental kind [obvious]

[iii]            All reality is experiential [from [i] and [ii]]

[iv]            Experiential reality can't also be non-experiential reality [premise]

[v]            There is no non-experiential reality [from [iii] and [iv]]

The world of pure panpsychism is best conceived along the lines of Eddington and Russell: "the energy-stuff that makes up the whole of reality is itself something that is experiential in every respect." (243) And given Strawson's identification of experience and experiencer we get this:

pure panpsychism has only one kind of thing in its fundamental ontology: subjects of experience in the 'thin' sense… subjects of experience each of which is at the same time an experience, and experiencing, i.e. literally identical with an experience or experiencing. (247)

Notwithstanding his fondness for the Spinozistical (and paradoxical) version of monism, Strawson admits that pure panpsychism is "arguably the only respectable kind of panpsychism." (246) This, then, is the position to which the materialist who is serious about experience should retreat, according to Strawson.

How do microexperiences compose macroexperiences, according to the pure panpsychist? On this question Strawson simply stands his ground: "unintelligible experiential-from-experiential emergence is not nearly as bad as unintelligible experiential-from-non-experiential emergence." (250) The subject thesis -- no experience without an experiencer -- makes this problem particularly difficult: how can my experience be composed of the experiences of other subjects, experiences that I necessarily do not know "from-the-inside"? (256) There must be, Strawson speculates, "Laws of Experiential Composition" that govern this process. But he is well aware that "all this needs, to put it mildly, development." (261) Quoting Goff, he owns up to his "faith that it must happen somehow" (60) and closes by saying that "the only argument for the claim that macroexperientiality emerges from microexperientiality… is transcendental… "(262)

How much do we know about our experiences? Do we have a fully transparent grasp of our own experiences? In the case of experience, "the having is the knowing." (251) In having the experience "I am acquainted with the essential nature of the experience in certain respects." (252) But this intimate grasp of experience "need not involve exhaustive knowledge of its nature." (253) That is, the nature of our experience is not fully revealed to us -- the full revelation thesis is false. And that is what saves panpsychism from the sorts of objections raised by Goff and Papineau. Pure panpsychists can agree that experience can have aspects that are hidden from us.

How little do we know about matter -- the non-experiential? The theme of our ignorance is present throughout RM and it resurfaces in the opening section of PR: "The only lesson of science that I apply is the general lesson that we are profoundly in the dark about the nature of things, and in particular the nature of the non-experiential." (185) But how, asks Stoljar, can Strawson know that the experiential cannot emerge from the non-experiential, if he knows nothing about the non-experiential? (cf. 174, 272) As in the case of the revelation of our own experiences, Strawson addresses this problem by backing off slightly: "I am not a radical Ignorantist." (272) Our ignorance of the non-experiential does not rob the intuition that the experiential cannot emerge out of the non-experiential of its force. It remains as a powerful but "unargued intuition". (21, 272)

There is, of course, much more in Strawson's PR. The most important feature (entirely omitted from this review) is the degree to which Strawson's thought is historically informed. As the full title of PR indicates, Descartes is the hero of this piece. Spinoza does quite well too; and honorable mention goes to Locke, Hume, and Kant. The references to the contributions of contemporary philosophers -- those unfortunate enough to be alive in "the silliest of all the centuries, philosophically speaking"[3] -- are few and, for the most part, considerably less enthusiastic.

What is one to make of Strawson's case for panpsychism (pure or Spinozistical)? First, it is important to recall that the argument is directed at the materialist/physicalist who takes experience seriously. The form of the argument is: "If you accept physicalism, if, that is, you are a serious and realistic materialist, then you also have to accept this." (186) The argument is, in that sense, "dialectically ad hominem." (186) Given the radical nature of the conclusion, most materialists will see Strawson's argument as a reductio ad absurdum of one or the other of its premises. Many of the materialist contributors to this volume reject Strawson's claim that taking experience seriously makes it impossible to specify experience in non-experiential terms. That is how they block the path to panpsychism. But what of those materialists who agree that experience is unanalyzable and irreducible? Herbert Feigl -- a bona fide member of the pantheon of 20th century materialists -- saw the problem in these terms and arrived at a view that, at least according to some of his critics, was a form of panpsychism. But few philosophers followed Feigl's lead and his work is now mostly forgotten or misrepresented. (cf. 268) John Searle's reflections on the mind's place in nature show some interesting parallels to the thoughts of Feigl and Strawson. But the adoption of property dualism seems to be the preferred route among contemporary materialists who find themselves confronted with irreducibly mental features. David Chalmers and, more recently, Jaegwon Kim come to mind. Strawson's claim that property dualism is incoherent is grounded in a quite controversial view about the relationship of substances and properties. So the materialists who embraced property dualism may not feel seriously challenged. Traditional Dualists, rather than the target audience of realistic materialists, may be the ones who will appreciate Strawson's labors the most. For surely the dualist is right to think that if Strawson has shown that the realistic materialist must choose between eliminativism, pure panpsychism, or Spinozistical panpsychism, dualism looks better than ever.



[1] Thomas Nagel: "The Psychophysical Nexus" in his Concealment and Exposure, New York: OUP 2002, p. 231.

[2] For a serious but critical attempt to come to terms with some of Strawson's metaphysical proposals, see Peter van Inwagen's paper: "The Self. The Incredulous Stare Articulated", Ratio XVII, 2004, pp. 478-491.

[3] Strawson writing in the TLS on October 27 of 2000.