Consciousness and Meaning: Selected Essays

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Brian Loar, Consciousness and Meaning: Selected Essays, Katalin Balog and Stephanie Beardman (eds.), Oxford University Press, 2017, 330pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673353.

Reviewed by Joseph Levine, University of Massachusetts Amherst


Brian Loar died in 2014 after a long illness. His widow, Stephanie Beardman, one of the two editors of this collection, explains that before his illness incapacitated him, Loar had arranged to have a collection of his papers published. Though he didn't live to see the project come to fruition, we are all grateful to the editors for making these seminal papers available in one volume.

The collection has two sections, Part I on "Philosophy of Language" and Part II on "Philosophy of Mind". Most of the papers in the Language section were published before those in the Mind section, perhaps reflecting a shift in emphasis in Loar's work over the years (though, as I will try to show below, his chief ideas and concerns are manifested in both domains). Each part is introduced with a lengthy survey of the papers included in it; Stephen Schiffer introduces those on language, Katalin Balog those on mind. Both knew Loar intimately over many years -- Schiffer a life-long friend and colleague, and Balog, one of his Ph.D. students and also a good friend. Readers will find the introductions of great value.

Though, as I said, the collection is divided into two sections, after reading them all through it became apparent that many of the same ideas and concerns animated Loar's work in both areas. As I read these intricate, insightful, and, I have to say, often difficult papers, I kept thinking of something Brian once said to me during a discussion about phenomenal consciousness. He said that if you think of solving a philosophical problem as untying a knot, then he loved to marshal considerations -- constraints on a solution -- that made the knot so complex as to seem intractable -- and then magically, as it were, untie it. One can see this method at work throughout the volume. Loar is continually acknowledging the force of intuitions and arguments that pull in opposite directions, and then constructing a position that apparently reconciles them. So instead of marching through the volume and discussing the papers individually, I will proceed by presenting the principal Loarian considerations, as revealed through the many papers, show how they build a philosophical knot of apparent intractability, and then present Loar's attempt at untying it. I will contend that the knot he built resists his attempts to untie it, though these attempts provide a wealth of philosophical insight despite that.

The "knot" is constructed from a number of fundamental ideas. The first is physicalism, or "naturalism", in Loar's words. Since I think "naturalism" can mean a number of different things, I'll use "physicalism". Loar is definitely committed to physicalism as it is understood in philosophy of mind; indeed, his position is the paradigm of what Chalmers (1996) calls "Type-B Physicalism". The main idea is that all phenomena supervene on, or are "grounded" in, fundamental physical processes and states. Operationally, physicalism entails the metaphysical impossibility of zombies -- creatures that are physically identical to normal human beings but have no conscious experience.

Another of Loar's commitments -- and this is what makes his physicalism of "Type B" -- is that there is no conceptual connection between physicalist-functionalist concepts and so-called "phenomenal concepts", by which is meant the first-personal concepts of phenomenal properties that we all acquire through experiencing them. So, even though phenomenal properties supervene on physical properties, it is not the case that there is any a priori entailment from even the most comprehensive physical-functional description to phenomenal descriptions. While physicalism mandates that there is a metaphysical entailment between the two descriptions, Loar maintains there is no conceptual entailment.

The term "non-reductive physicalism" is sometimes used to characterize this position, but Loar eschews it explicitly. In fact, in chapter 12, "Elimination vs. Non-reductive Physicalism", Loar argues against what he calls "non-reductive physicalism". So what distinguishes his "Type B" physicalism from the "non-reductive" variety? To be a physicalist, for Loar, is to subscribe to supervenience: no difference in mental properties without a difference in physical properties. What then distinguishes non-reductive from Type B physicalism is that on the latter there is an explanation of the supervenience and on the former there isn't. (This isn't quite how Loar puts it, it's my own formulation, but I believe it captures what he had in mind.). For all versions of Type B physicalism that I know of the idea is that while phenomenal properties may not be identified with straightforwardly physical properties -- like neurological properties -- they can at least be identified with functional properties. We can then get an explanation -- indeed a derivation (in principle) -- of the supervenience of the mental on the physical by first identifying the mental with the functional, which would be done on empirical grounds, and then deriving the relevant functional description from the physical one. The problem Loar sees with non-reductive physicalism -- and I agree wholeheartedly with him here -- is that it leaves the metaphysical supervenience relation brute and unexplained.

Getting back then to Type B, the question arises whether the metaphysical entailment without the conceptual one presents a problem. While Chalmers argues it does, my view is that only if one adopts a broadly Fregean account of meaning is there any tension here. So the next Loarian principle to throw into the mix is his broadly Fregean account of meaning. What I mean by this is that Loar is committed to the idea that meaning, intentionality generally, is a matter of how the subject herself "conceives" the world. To use Frege's term, it's constituted by the "mode of presentation" of the world to the subject. If we want to understand what someone means by her use of language -- or just the contents of her thoughts -- then we have to see how she is conceiving the world. This way of understanding meaning and the intentionality of thought is contrasted with the broadly Russellian view that language -- whether public or mental -- is directly about objects and properties in the world. To know how a subject conceives of things is just to know the referents of her public and mental symbols.

Most of the papers in Part I are Loar's working out how to maintain the basic Fregean idea in the face of the arguments of Kripke, Putnam, and especially Burge (1979). The view that names and natural kind terms rigidly designate is not itself that hard to accommodate. One can allow that the modal behavior of such terms is governed by external world conditions and still maintain that there is a level of meaning that captures the internal, narrow content determined by how the subject conceives of the world.

Usually it is claimed by those who believe in narrow content that this aspect of meaning is captured by the "that-clause" involved in de dicto attributions of propositional attitudes. But given Burge's arguments about the meaning of "arthritis" -- arguments that Loar endorses -- one can't retreat to this position. In particular, in response to the challenge to produce a sentence that precisely captures narrow content, Loar admits that Burge's arguments seem to show that this is impossible. The problem is, Loar says, that public language is irremediably infected with external, particularly social deferential, meaning. But he challenges the assumption made in most discussions of content that that-clauses are supposed to capture subjective meaning, or narrow content. Indeed, he argues in several of the papers in Part I that this assumption is responsible for the failure to accurately characterize the subject's point of view on her own thoughts and statements. In particular, he argues in chapter 5, "Names in Thought", that abandoning this assumption is the key to solving Kripke's puzzle about Pierre.

So what does capture narrow content, or subjective meaning, as he often terms it? Loar is basically a conceptual-role theorist when it comes to narrow meaning. In Part I this is developed across several papers, it is elaborated in the first couple of papers in Part II, and then by the end of Part II it is changed somewhat to accommodate what he, along with others following him, called "phenomenal intentionality". Let me describe the dialectic as it unfolds across the papers in both Parts I and II.

There are two problems that confront his position on subjective meaning. First, holism. It's notoriously hard to see how to cordon off just those conceptual connections that are meaning-constituting from the rest that result from the acquisition of knowledge about the world. This is a problem so long as one wants to generalize over many individuals when attributing meanings and thought contents. If you want to say that one has to believe that all bachelors are unmarried in order to properly be claimed to have a belief in which the concept of a bachelor figures, that doesn't seem hard to accommodate. But if you have to also share beliefs about the living habits of bachelors with someone else in order to be said to have the same concept as they do, then it seems hopeless. To this challenge -- which Loar does acknowledge at several points in Part I -- he responds with what seems to me just a hope that the appropriate cordoning off can be accomplished. Nowhere, at least in this volume, does he really tackle the problem. (On page 75, in chapter 4, "Must Beliefs Be Sentences?", he does make a few remarks addressing the problem, but they are quite sketchy.)

There is another challenge that Loar does address throughout these papers, and to my mind it's the more interesting one. As he puts it at one point, conceptual role seems too "formal", too "syntactic", to adequately capture how a subject conceives of her world, a semantic, intentional notion that seems to have "aboutness", or "directedness", as he often puts it, built into it. After all, what we're trying to characterize with this notion of subjective, or narrow, meaning is the way the world is according to the conception of the subject: how do you do that with a system of relations among representations? Don't we need a notion of truth conditions -- how the world would be if it conformed to one's subjective conception -- to capture narrow meaning?

Loar presents the problem of how to understand subjective, or narrow, content in greatest detail in chapter 9, "Subjective Intentionality". The chapter begins:

To say that mental content or intentionality is in the head is to say this: internal properties of the mind constitute how a person represents the world to himself. Not 'they constitute the means by which he represents the world to himself,' but 'they constitute the way the world is according to how he represents it to himself, how he conceives the facts, how he conceives the world as being.' (165)

Crucial to Loar's notion of subjective intentionality is the idea that "knowledge of the references of my own thoughts is privileged in a certain way, and that perspective involves no apparent conceptions of external reference relations." (172-3) To use his example, when I think to myself that Freud lived in Vienna, "I register what the thought is about" (173), and this doesn't seem open to doubt or require descriptive knowledge of the causal/historical/social conditions that led to this thought. So one's internal, private content is imbued with "aboutness", intentionality, of a sort that is distinct from the kind of external, socially conditioned reference described by Kripke-Putnam-Burge. Immediately after presenting this thesis, Loar launches into a discussion of its two principal challenges: the "Argument from That-Clauses" and the "Argument from Unmotivation".

We have already talked about the issue of that-clauses, so I'll skip that here. The more interesting problem is "Unmotivation". Here is how he puts it: "Internal properties -- whether biochemical, neurophysiological, psychofunctional, or common-sense functional -- cannot motivate the ascription of, or explain, or imply, externally directed truth conditions." Yet, we experience ourselves as thinking genuine thoughts that determine a conception of the world apparently independently of our external causal-historical-social relations. Putting Unmotivation together with subjective intentionality, Loar asks: "If I wish to accommodate both intuitive perspectives -- the subjective/projective perspective and the naturalistic third-person perspective -- must I lapse into dualism?" (175)

Loar proposes in this paper to exploit a move that, in his later "Phenomenal States" (chapter 10), he uses to defend materialism about phenomenal consciousness. Since this move is itself one of Loar's most important contributions to philosophy of mind, let me review his position on phenomenal states and then explain how it is supposed to apply to subjective intentionality.

The Conceivability Argument against materialism has been around a long time, at least since Descartes's Meditation 6. The basic idea is that there seems to be no way of inferring the distribution of phenomenal properties in the world -- or even whether there are any at all -- from even the most exhaustive specification of its physical properties. This has convinced many that phenomenal properties do not supervene on physical properties, since, as mentioned earlier, to suppose they do would be to allow an unexplained, brute metaphysical connection between the two kinds of properties. Loar, as mentioned earlier, agrees with anti-materialists that we don't want such brute metaphysical connections. However, he sees a way out by positing the existence of what he calls "phenomenal concepts" -- concepts acquired within the first-person perspective that are basically "recognitional" in nature. One's concept of phenomenal red, say, is just one's ability to recognize an instance of a reddish experience as of the same type as one has experienced before. These are subjective concepts in that one must experience the relevant properties oneself in order to form phenomenal concepts of them.

Loar's move is to say that although there is no conceptual or epistemic link between our phenomenal concepts and the concepts formed within the naturalistic third-person perspective -- physical-functional concepts -- there is no reason that the two radically different kinds of concepts cannot in fact refer to the very same properties. So what I pick out subjectively by its experienced qualitative character -- say, a visual experience of a red rose -- is itself a state, or property that is picked out by some physical-functional description.

Notice that the absence of an appropriate conceptual connection between physical and mental concepts is problematic primarily for Fregean notions of concepts, not Russellian ones. On the latter, there are symbols and the things they refer to, so there doesn't seem to be a problem in there being distinct symbols that just happen to refer to the same thing. But on the Fregean conception -- to which, as mentioned above, Loar subscribes -- concepts involve more than symbols with pointers to objects and properties; rather, they embody conceptions of how things are, which seems to mean that they include within themselves objects and properties. So if one can't infer from one description to another, it appears the two conceptions embodied in these two descriptions must involve distinct objects or properties, which undermines materialism. By introducing the notion of a phenomenal concept, Loar gets to have his Fregean cake but eat it like a Russellian.

So, now let's return to subjective intentionality. Allegiance to the idea that mental content is about how the subject herself conceives the world is the core of Loar's Fregeanism. In a sense, the anti-naturalistic challenge which seems to be problematic only for the Fregean conception is now aimed at that very conception itself: how can it be that the internal conditions that objectively, from the third-person perspective, obtain when one is entertaining a thought are also the very same conditions that we recognize subjectively as involving reference to objects and properties in a privileged, "transparent" manner? Loar's reply is that this question cannot be answered, for the same reason that we can't explain why the relevant physical-functional properties constitute phenomenal experiences. That is, our experience of subjective intentionality gives rise to a kind of "phenomenal concept" of thought -- a first-person perspective concept that is triggered in the very having of a thought, and there is no way to infer descriptions involving such concepts from those couched in purely third-person, naturalistic terms. I will explore this proposal a little more below, but first we need to introduce the final element, "phenomenal intentionality".

Above I described Loar's treatment of the two problems brought up in chapter 9, the problem of that-clauses and that of Unmotivation. But there is still the third problem mentioned earlier, about the merely formal character of conceptual role and how that seems to conflict with its ability to ground a notion of a subject's conception of the world. This is where phenomenal intentionality enters the scene, and with this doctrine Loar simultaneously addresses this problem for his position on subjective intentionality along with the raging debate over representationalism about phenomenal properties.

A three-sided debate concerning the intentionality of phenomenal properties has been going on for the last two decades or so. Many materialists about phenomenal consciousness have argued that phenomenal properties are essentially representational properties (Alex Byrne, Dretske 1995, Harman 1990, and Michael Tye). To visually experience red is for one's visual system to represent the surface reflectance property of being red (or something of the sort). What's crucial for these philosophers is that representation be understood in a naturalistic -- usually causal/nomic -- manner. The idea is to reduce the mind-body problem from two problems -- phenomenality and intentionality -- to only one, intentionality, with the further idea that this is the more tractable problem. Opponents claim that while phenomenal properties might represent certain external (naturalistic) properties, like surface reflectances, their representational features are not essential and intrinsic to them (Block 1990). Thus inversion scenarios are possible, where my reddish experience represents red but my inverted twin's experience -- qualitatively identical -- represents green.

The third side in the debate is the phenomenal intentionality position, adopted by Loar. (I believe he coined the term. See Kriegel 2013 for the current state of play on this topic.) Proponents of this position share with the representationalists the claim that phenomenal properties (at least those involved in normal perception) are inherently intentional, so that experiencing red is a matter of having redness presented to the subject. However, unlike the representationalists, they do not share the view that intentionality can be given a naturalistic analysis, so therefore this is not a reductionist view in the way that representationalism is. While Loar is a naturalist/physicalist, as emphasized above, he does not sign on to the standard naturalization views of intentionality. His reductivism, as described earlier, comes via the phenomenal concept move of synthetically identifying both phenomenal and intentional properties with physical-functional ones.

But phenomenal intentionality is not for Loar merely a thesis about phenomenal character, it also, as I mentioned, plays an important role for him in addressing the "it's merely syntactic" challenge to his appeal to conceptual role as the basis of internal meaning. We have this first-person perspective on our thought and experience which seems to involve a way the world seems to us, and mere relations among ideas don't seem to get at the apparent "aboutness" of it. But if we start with the intentionality inherent in phenomenal experience -- that phenomenal experience is itself a way of being presented with a way the world is, at least regarding its perceptible properties, then we have the basis for building a genuine notion of how the subject conceives the world. Conceptual role still plays a fundamental role, as the conceptual connections that obtain among phenomenal experiences and thoughts involving many different kinds of concepts (natural kind, social deferential, etc.) will be the determiners of the latter's subjective intentional properties. But the idea is that the "directedness" of phenomenal intentionality provides the basis for the claim that subjective intentionality constitutively involves a way of conceiving of the world.

There are two puzzling features of Loar's attempted reconciliation of the subjective with the objective perspectives on phenomenal character and intentionality. First, his phenomenal concept move, to the extent it provides him with the benefits of a Russellian approach to informative identities, seems to undermine the rich subjective conception he's trying to capture. It's one thing to say that phenomenal concepts are demonstrative or recognitional in character and so don't include the kinds of internal relations to other concepts that could ground a priori connections, but to the extent that this works to block the conceivability argument it seems to do so on the basis of a largely Russellian conception of phenomenal concepts. But with phenomenal experiences we seem to have what I have previously called "substantive and determinate" conceptions of these properties, and so thinning out phenomenal concepts in the way Loar does seems to make phenomenal concepts inadequate to capture their subjective meaning. (This objection is developed in Levine 2007.)

Second, since he wants to endow even fully hallucinatory experience -- as in a brain in a vat -- with subjective intentionality, and since intentionality for him constitutively involves "directedness" toward objects and properties, he has to deny that the feature of being internally directed on objects and properties involves any genuine relation. Directedness, for Loar, is a fully intrinsic feature of subjective intentional states. I suppose in a way this makes his phenomenal concept move to deal with Unmotivation easier, as there is now no need to locate any of the objects and properties on which one's subjective intentional states are directed within the objective realm of brain states and external objects. Rather, just as a reddish phenomenal character just is a physical-functional state, with no explanatory connection, he seems to be saying that the directedness of subjective intentionality just is a certain physical-functional property. However, if it was hard to buy that reddishness just is one or another neurological state, I find the idea that being experientially presented with something reddish just is this neurological state even less compelling.

I can't develop that worry here in any detail, but let me just say this. If one is really being true to the phenomenological perspective, as Loar obviously is trying to, then one thing that seems important to capture is the difference between failing to refer in thought and hallucinating. I think to myself "Abraham is the father of the Israelites" and I experience a pink elephant in front of me when sufficiently inebriated. Bible scholars tell me there is no biblical Abraham, and that's fine. Abraham didn't seem to really enter my subjectivity while purportedly thinking about him, so his loss doesn't seem to leave out any aspect of the thought episode. But pinkness and elephant-shape were quite concretely part of my experience when hallucinating the pink elephant. It's hard to characterize the experience without appeal to these properties. That's part of what I was trying to capture by saying that my conception of the experience is "substantive and determinate". But now, with the doctrine of phenomenal intentionality, we add the relational element, that these features are objects of my conscious apprehension. This certainly seems to capture the structure of phenomenal experience, but then it seems very hard to see how you can then just say there is only a "purported" reference here; no real relation, just an intrinsic property of directedness. I think it's necessary to give internal intentionality more metaphysical backing than Loar is willing to. His unwillingness is captured by the quoted remark earlier, when he asked, "must I lapse into dualism?" My claim is that if you really want to credit the deliverances of the first-person perspective, you do have to lapse into dualism, or something non-physicalist, for the reasons just cited. Admittedly this worry is characterized intuitively and vaguely, but it's the best I can do here.

While I don't think Loar's grand reconciliation works in the end, the philosophical depth and insight manifested throughout the papers is striking. I want to end by quoting both editors: According to Balog, "Brian was the kind of philosopher that always goes for the most fundamental, deepest issue. He rarely wrote papers on small, technical questions. His sweep was grand" (137). From Beardman: "He was, as they say, a philosopher's philosopher: fellow philosophers read him to learn not just what he thinks, but how he thinks." These statements both perfectly capture how I felt after finishing this volume.


Thanks to both Janet Levin and Georges Rey for reading and commenting on an earlier version of this review.


Block, N. 1990. "Inverted Earth", Philosophical Perspectives, 4: Action Theory and Philosophy of Mind, J. Tomberlin, ed., Ridgeview Publishing Co., 53-80.

Burge, T. 1979. "Individualism and the Mental," in French, Uehling, and Wettstein (eds.) Midwest Studies in Philosophy, IV, University of Minnesota Press, pp. 73 -- 121.

Chalmers, D. 1996. The Conscious Mind. Oxford University Press.

Dretske, F. 1995. Naturalizing the Mind. Bradford Books/ MIT Press.

Harman, G. 1990. "The Intrinsic Quality of Experience", in J. Tomberlin, ed., Philosophical Perspectives, 4, Action Theory and Philosophy of Mind, Ridgeview Publishing Co., 31-52.

Kriegel, U. (ed.) 2013. Phenomenal Intentionality, Oxford University Press.

Levine, J. 2007. "Phenomenal Concepts and the Materialist Constraint", in Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge, eds. Torin Alter and Sven Walter, Oxford University Press.