Consciousness and Mental Life

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Daniel N. Robinson, Consciousness and Mental Life, Columbia University Press, 2007, 264pp., $29.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231141000.

Reviewed by Sam Coleman, University of Hertfordshire


Consciousness and Mental Life seeks to demonstrate that something is seriously wrong with contemporary philosophy of mind. In fact, that there are at least three things wrong: Descartes is given an unduly bad press, the contribution of philosophers of the past to mind-theory is not properly appreciated by their descendants of today, and the current physicalist orthodoxy is deeply mistaken, both in its own right and in its deference to mainstream science. The book's real payoff is the message that philosophers of mind have a duty to pay careful attention to what their fellows have said, but this pays off in an unexpected way.

Robinson's central thesis is briefly as follows: There is far less to be gained from modern philosophy of mind and its interplay with the mind-sciences than is widely thought, especially when one properly examines the work on these issues carried out by great historical philosophers. Robinson's list includes Plato and Aristotle, up to Reid and James, but it is above all Descartes, he opines, who either foresaw current 'advances' in mind-theory, or else presented considerations powerful enough that, properly understood (as presently they are not), prove fatal to most every current analysis of mind. For Robinson, physicalism's falsity is quite clear, and Descartes -- read aright -- has already had more or less the final word on the mind/body problem.

At an impressive pace (Consciousness and Mental Life just tips two-hundred pages) we are led through the gleaming monuments of doctrines of the past, and the glow from these is used to illuminate what for Robinson are the mere follies of the present, either copying desirable earlier features, or abominating them. The first chapter informs us about Plato's and Aristotle's philosophy of mind, drawing interesting connections with classical work on the theory of rhetoric. I found this chapter duly reflective of the complexities of thought of these two great minds, and it contained the novel contention that their views, particularly in Plato's case, could in several respects be considered contemporary. Not a Plato or Aristotle expert however, I reserve my substantive comments for the appearance in the book of later philosophers of mind.

From chapter two onwards Descartes becomes the hero of the piece, and modern philosophy of mind the main villain. It would be fair to characterise this, the large proportion of the text, as a highly fluid discussion of an extremely wide range of issues connected to mind, with Descartes often appearing either for Robinson to defend him against some modern misapprehension, or to employ Cartesian considerations to help sweep the floor with one theory or another from the last half-century or so. It is worth making clear the extraordinary range of this discussion: Cartesian critique is meted out to theories and ideas including anomalous monism, eliminativism, emergentism, epiphenomenalism, determinism, functionalism, H.O.T. theory, Humean causation, mental supervenience, National Socialism, semantic externalism, the puzzle of Theseus' ship and type and token identity theories. And to plot his favoured course through these matters, Robinson sees the need to set the record straight on what have traditionally been considered thorny issues for Descartes, such as the power of scepticism, and the precise nature of the union of non-physical mind with body. Philosophers would be forgiven a wince at the list of topics broached in this book: they are of a depth and variegation that many of us would not hope to treat inside of a lifetime. I can only say that it is a testimony to the ambition of Consciousness and Mental Life that it aims to resolve all of these matters.

There's not space here to delve in a detailed way into Robinson's thoughts on more than a couple of issues, so I concentrate on those that seem to me most central to understanding the state of the art in philosophy of mind, and whose treatment perhaps best reveals the book's quality. Before diving in we should be explicit about Robinson's core philosophical thesis: he appears as an unapologetic substance dualist, and has only short shrift to offer modern physicalism and its main drivers, such as the much-vaunted idea of the 'completeness of physics', as he terms it. Robinson presents himself here as arm in arm with his protagonist: Descartes, we are told, inclined strongly towards materialism, but found himself forced to give it up in the face of the palpable failure of objective, scientific endeavour to capture the nature of mind. Modern philosophers of mind, Robinson feels, are criminally close to eliminating this nature, such is the thrall that they are held in by scientism.

Let us begin, then, with Robinson's assessment of the completeness of physics. This is where, unfortunately, things go a little awry. For the discussion in Consciousness and Mental Life just does not adequately capture the completeness of physics, or its role in putative proofs of physicalism's truth.

The completeness of physics is the doctrine that if an event occurs that is describable in the language of physics, then it has a sufficient cause that's also describable in the language of physics. How does this doctrine figure in closing the case for physicalism? The answer is that it does not, at least not without some heavyweight additional assumptions. For the completeness of physics to lead to physicalism's truth -- the truth of the claim that everything is physical -- one needs to assume that mental items cause, and that their effects are describable in the language of physics. Given these two assumptions, one gets the result that mental items are describable in the language of physics, and are thus, in that sense, physical. On this latter point: it is a matter of no little controversy amongst self-avowed physicalists whether and to what extent all physical causes in the world can be adequately described in the language of physics. For example, a statue is (for most people) an unproblematically physical item, and it may be the cause of a window breaking (if bashed against it, say). But many, including some physicalists, would dispute that the event of the statue -- qua statue -- breaking the window could be captured in the language of physics: Among other considerations, the concept STATUE doesn't figure in physics. So if it were the completeness of physics as just explained that were the key to physicalism's truth, why then physicalism's truth would likely be refuted by items as commonplace as statues, leaving aside minds. For such reasons, physicalists have allowed themselves to talk in terms of the completeness of the physical, where this includes those items described by all of (physical) science, not just physics. In addition, the sense of 'physical' is stretched further by allowing anything that supervenes on items that are physical in the sense just explained to count as physical also. On this understanding of 'physical', a statue can be unproblematically physical. And on this understanding of the idea of completeness, anything that breaks a window -- a physical happening -- will itself be physical.

And now back to the former assumption, that mental items cause. This is for most philosophers a premise beyond doubt, and likewise the premise that mental items cause physical effects: for example, fits of rage can cause window-breakings, by causing kicking of statues that consequently bash windows. And this yields the interesting argument for physicalism, the one that applies to the mental: If mental items have physical effects, and all physical effects have sufficient physical causes, then, disallowing systematic overdetermination of these effects, the mental causes must also be physical.

We have distinguished the completeness of physics from the completeness of the physical, and seen how the latter idea functions in an argument for physicalism's truth. This done, it is clear that Robinson conflates the completeness of physics with the completeness of the physical. But perhaps simply replacing the former phrase with the latter will rehabilitate his discussion? Sadly not, for there is a further confusion. For example, Robinson states that "it was Descartes more than most of his contemporaries who was inclined towards the completeness of physics -- toward physicalism -- and it was this very inclination that found him opposing the "Aristotelians"" (67). This quote makes it clear that Robinson thinks the completeness of physics, which we are charitably reading as the completeness of the physical, is equivalent to physicalism. This is not so, and neither does the completeness of the physical anywhere near imply physicalism; unless, that is, one can rule out that mental items are epiphenomenal when it comes to the physical world. But this is an option Robinson consistently overlooks when surveying the logical territory between physicalism and dualism.

It is true that Robinson at one point discusses a doctrine he labels 'epiphenomenalism', but again, a lack of full grasp of the theory is evident, and telling: When introducing the idea of consciousness as an epiphenomenon, he cites Huxley's comparison of consciousness with the sound produced by a bell.[1] This has a promising ring to it, Robinson here entertaining the possibility that consciousness might be 'a mere byproduct' (34). But the very next page finds him asserting that epiphenomenalism denies the immateriality of consciousness. On the contrary, epiphenomenalism has been deployed almost exclusively as a variety of dualism: not least, epiphenomenalism is the position Jackson reaches after giving his famous 'knowledge argument' against physicalism.[2]

Robinson does not satisfactorily characterise the nature of contemporary physicalism (and its main motivation: the causal argument from physical causal completeness), nor of epiphenomenalism. Thus his rejection of the modern route[3] to physicalism will not do much to deter others who come across it. Surely, though, in a book largely dedicated to Descartes, Robinson does better when it comes to discussing, and defending, Cartesian interactionist substance dualism?

Any dualist worth his salt ought to have serious things to say when it comes to the rationale for his dualism and  the problem of the hypothesised causal interaction between mind and body, supposedly radically different substances, one of which has, where the other lacks, physical mass, location and extension. Let's consider what Robinson has to say about these points in turn.

Why does Robinson reject physicalism in favour of dualism? A reason seems to be provided when he says:

It is entirely unclear as to what is meant by the claim that although consciousness does not match the properties of the constituents of which it is formed, it is no more than a compound of them. At a common-sense level, we would be inclined to say of something having the salient properties A, B and C that it could not arise from a combination of other things having not one of these properties … it is not unfair to apply the test of credulity and to begin to think of a reality that really does bifurcate. (33)

But were Robinson right here the upshot would in fact be a massive pluralism, not dualism. To take one homely example, by this reasoning the constitution of a liquid by non-liquid molecules would entail that liquidity was a physically irreducible property. And so on for every case where a supervening property was missing from its ontological underpinnings, of which there are innumerably many. And yet it is in fact fairly well understood how non-liquid components can yield a liquid composite -- roughly, they have to be loosely bound together, so that they can slide around. Likewise, many physicalists hold, there may well be a story, agreed we don't yet know it and may never, about how non-conscious physical matter combines to form a conscious physical whole.

There has been, to be fair, recent work challenging the intelligibility of consciousness' emergence from non-conscious underpinnings, for example Strawson's (2006). But this objection to physicalism is of a far more sophisticated nature, and is ignored by Consciousness and Mental Life. Robinson may well be right to criticise contemporary philosophers of mind for not having sufficiently studied the distinguished philosophers of the past, but for his part he appears not well enough versed in the philosophical work of the present day, much of which is valuable (even if much is not). Ironically, Robinson would find a strong ally in Strawson when it comes to his feeling that philosophers of the present neglect those of the past at their peril.

Elsewhere, Robinson justifies his dualism thus: 'No one disputes the ultimate materiality of oak tables or of water[4]. [However] Consciousness lacks the "feel" of materiality' (36). It is not easy to know how to understand this claim: what is the 'feel' of materiality? If that is meant to be something to do with the way material things feel when touched by sentient beings, then consciousness clearly has everything to do with this feeling, since it is a feeling. If the thought is that consciousness doesn't appear to be material,well, that is something philosophers have sometimes claimed.[5] But just as clearly if consciousness is material then this supposed appearance is simply misleading. And that appearance could never provide an argument for dualism on pain of begging the question. The puzzle of consciousness' putative physicality is indeed a puzzle, but the mere fact of its being a puzzle doesn't imply straight off that physicalism is false, let alone that dualism is true. Things are not, cannot be, that simple.

On the interaction problem Consciousness and Mental Life toys with two solutions (setting aside its unduly rapid dismissal of epiphenomenalism as an option). In some moods Robinson relies on our personal experiences of mental causation: since our minds clearly move our bodies, the 'interaction problem' must be a mere piece of philosopher's sophistry. But it is unclear, to say the least, how this manoeuvre is meant to render intelligible the causal interaction of a massless, locationless, extensionless substance with a massy, located and extended one. And it is this lack of intelligibility in which the interaction problem consists.

A more sophisticated option that Robinson entertains is a Humean dissolution of the reality of causation: on this account mind and body enter into closely correlated behaviours, and that is all there is to saying that they causally interact. This solution is, as Robinson himself acknowledges, unsatisfactory. He correctly points out that we are unlikely to want to give up the causal realist interpretation of mind's power over body. I would go further: to turn to regularity theory to solve the puzzle of mind's interaction with body is something of a bad joke.

Overall this is a strange book: anyone conversant with the material Robinson discusses will see through his lack of argument and reasoned thought-progression. Anyone who isn't so conversant just won't be able to decipher the text, I fear. So I cannot recommend to anyone to read the book.


Huxley, T. H. 1874. "On the Hypothesis that Animals Are Automata and its History." In Fortnightly Review, 22: 199-245.

Jackson, F. 1982. "Epiphenomenal Qualia." In Philosophical Quarterly, 32: 127-136.

Papineau, D. 2002. Thinking about Consciousness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Strawson, G. 2006. "Real Materialism: Does Physicalism Entail Panpsychism?" In Journal of Consciousness Studies, Vol. 13, No. 10-11.

[1] Huxley 1874. This is of course not a very happy comparison in the first place, since the sound of a bell is certainly causal: it causes people to go to church and birds to take flight, for instance.

[2] Jackson 1982.

[3] Although the reasoning in question very arguably goes back to Descartes' interlocutor, Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia.

[4] Although we just saw that Robinson's reasoning might render water non-physical in respect, at least, of its liquidity.

[5] Papineau (2002) has a plausible physicalist story about the enduring intuition that mind and matter are different.