Consciousness and Perceptual Experience: An Ecological and Phenomenological Approach

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Thomas Natsoulas, Consciousness and Perceptual Experience: An Ecological and Phenomenological Approach, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 463pp. $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107004511.

Reviewed by Mohan Matthen, University of Toronto


This book is an extended consolidation of themes that Thomas Natsoulas has explored during his distinguished career as a theoretical psychologist. Taking a broadly Gibsonian perspective, informed and deepened by a critical take on Husserl, Natsoulas treats of perceptual consciousness as a presentation of the environment. His point of view is well summarized by this statement: "all intentional objects of all one's actual perceptual awarenesses are parts, occurrences, or features belonging to the environment -- which includes oneself as well" (276). As is evident from this snippet, the book is an extended defence of "direct realism." Perceptual consciousness never lacks environmental denotation, according to Natsoulas. "Even when we are visually perceiving in a hallucinatory manner, we see [the world itself] albeit erroneously for now. . . . I consider hallucinating to be a case of perceiving that resembles veridical cases of perceiving" (413).

This is an unusual and not wholly satisfactory take on the "argument from illusion" -- the argument that since two perceptual states identical in type can be about an environmental object in some circumstances, but not in others, both must share something non-environmental -- sense-data or something else internal to the mind. Some circumvent this argument by exploiting the technical resources of the theory of intentionality. Others, the so-called "disjunctivists," claim that hallucinations are different from veridical perceptions simply in virtue of being hallucinations, and so contrary to first appearance, there turns out to be no one determinate type of perceptual state that takes an environmental referent in some circumstances but not in others. Natsoulas, by contrast, rests his direct realism on the dubious empirical claim quoted above: hallucination is always engagement with a real part of the environment. No scenario similar to that envisaged in the film, The Matrix, is even possible.

Natsoulas's work is firmly scaffolded by a deep historical knowledge of such psychologists as William James, John Dewey, B. F. Skinner, D. O. Hebb, and of course J. J. Gibson. Significantly, however, he makes no mention of, and does not seem to be influenced by Konrad Lorenz, Horace Barlow, Jerome Lettvin, Noam Chomsky, David Marr, David Rumelhart and James McClelland, Anne Treisman, various Bayesians, Rodney Brooks, Christopher Frith, and many other revolutionary figures of the last one hundred or so years, scientists whose ideas have been the source of powerful (though often divergent) trends in recent philosophy of perception and mind. There is a degree of insularity in this, and also in the fact that fully one third of Natsoulas's references are to his own work. Despite this, the book is of considerable interest to anybody who is sympathetic to phenomenological treatments of the mind, and instructive (at the very least) to those of a more "analytic" bent. Readers will benefit from what it accomplishes, a sensitive exploration of the truth-like correspondence between perceptual consciousness and the real world, and of ways of treating of failures of correspondence -- illusions, hallucinations -- when they occur. They should not be deterred or deflected by what it does not attempt, a broader exploration of perception's role in enabling an organism to fit with its ecological niche, and of the methods beyond truth-telling by which it goes about playing this role.

Natsoulas writes "the present volume seeks to give some support to treatments of perceptual consciousness that crucially implicate both the ecological and the phenomenological" (203). He vehemently rejects the internalist idea that perception is directed toward events that take place in consciousness. He is, as we saw, a direct realist. We always directly perceive the environment, he insists. We perceive it in terms that are intelligible to ourselves: the environment is physical, but we do not perceive it as the physicist describes it. He resists the idea that we "construct" worlds through perception or theory: "Unlike a god, you do not make the world, far from it, by becoming conscious6 of it" (135). (Consciousness6 is defined as "normal wakefulness," distinct from that which accompanies dreams and altered states such as drunkenness.)

Natsoulas is uncomfortable with what is nowadays called "naïve" realism. He writes: "I do not comprehend how [perceptual] awarenesses . . . may justifiably be described as . . . comprised of [things] themselves and certain of their properties" (139). And: "With respect to perceptual consciousness, we need to take, as it were, an externalist and an internalist perspective" (203). He adopts (sometimes in a roundabout way) Husserl's idea that consciousness is structured to mirror the external world. Perceptual consciousness possesses intentional structure that reflects the ontological structure of the world in a way that reminds us of Wittgenstein's "picture theory." One of his centrepieces is a quotation from Levinas reflecting on Husserl: "Conscious life remained, in its existence, a substance patterned after material things" (90)

At the start of his book, Natsoulas affirms the value of conceptual analysis: "at this early stage in the development of psychological science, [we] should not be too eager to abandon the commonsense framework," he sensibly says (1). Accordingly, he outlines "six concepts The Oxford English Dictionary defines in its entries for consciousness and conscious." This is the latest iteration of work for which Natsoulas has been well known for quite a while: Fred Dretske (1997, 34) cites him, for instance, in his explanation of reflective consciousness. This differentiation of consciousness-concepts is central to Natsoulas's analytic project.

I was initially puzzled by the source of the six concepts, because when I looked up the OED, I found little correspondence with Natsoulas's list. It turns out that the six concepts actually derive from a short paper by Dewey (1906), who says, "I take my material from Murray's Oxford English Dictionary." (Natsoulas does not cite the OED at all; rather, he cites the New Shorter Oxford English Dictionary, 1993.) It is surprising that a dictionary should serve as a reference source for so ubiquitous a term -- dictionaries, particularly the OED, are concerned to separate and explain syntactically variant constructions involving a word, even when these don't necessarily mark distinct senses of the word in isolation. OED1's third sense is 'conscious to oneself' and its fourth sense is 'Hence, in same sense, without to oneself.' Natsoulas distinguishes these senses as occurrent awareness and inner awareness, but this neglects the "sameness" that the OED attributes to them. The source is even more surprising when you recall that Dewey was talking about the first edition: volume 2 ('C') of OED1 was published in 1893. How much can it tell us about today's "commonsense framework"? Does Natsoulas think that common sense is static? Surely, it is not.

The OED1 entry on 'conscious' began with a sense that, as Dewey says, "emphasizes the 'con-' factor: a social fact." It is defined as "sharing the knowledge of something with another." (This sense is 5th in the present online edition.) Two sources are given in Murray's version, the first from Hobbes who uses it in a phrase, "conscious of it one to another." This is a good example of the lexicographer's methodology; the definition paraphrases a construction in which the word occurs. The current edition of the OED follows the same methodology: "Compare the Latin construction of conscius with genitive of the thing known and dative of the person with whom the knowledge is shared." In both cases, it is the entire phrase or construction that is explicated. One cannot conclude from the definition that the word it contains has a distinct sense. In any event, the usage was clearly marked as obsolete, even in the 19th century.

The other quotation backing up the alleged shared-knowledge sense in OED1is from an otherwise unremembered minister named 'R. South,' who wrote, "Nothing is to be concealed from the other self. . . . To be a friend and to be conscious are terms equivalent." The friend is, in other words, one with whom all knowledge is shared; you and she are "conscious" by virtue of this intimate relationship. Now, South's usage has no claim to being older than standard philosophical uses; it is not the original sense, the OED reference to the Latin conscius notwithstanding. Murray gives the date as 1664; the current edition corrects this to 1694, which is later than Locke -- presumably a typesetter's inverted placement of '9' in Murray's edition. (The current edition gives five more quotations, but only one of these is clearly germane to shared consciousness.) The whole weight of Dewey's "shared" sense rests, then, on a single obscure quotation. I can think of no justification for why the alleged shared-knowledge sense of 'conscious,' clearly marked as obsolete in Murray and in the latest edition, should find a place either in Dewey or in Natsoulas. It is clearly a very special usage not seen since the 17th century, and certainly not the leading use even then.

Needless to say, it is the privacy of "philosophical" consciousness that Dewey wants to undermine. To this end, he is overly quick to grant priority to the shared-knowledge sense. Remarking on self consciousness, he writes: "Here is a distinctively personal adaptation of the social, or joint, use. The agent is, so to speak, reduplicated. In one capacity, he does certain things; in another he is cognizant of these goings-on" (1906, 39). Dewey's point had wide currency in the early 20th century. In 1911, G. A. Tawney wrote:

When in modern times the word con-scious-ness was invented, this was its earliest signification -- the knowing of things together by many minds. . . . This idea was generalized into the knowledge of knowledge, and consciousness came to be the individual's perception of what passes in his own mind. This is the primary meaning of the term in Locke's "Essay," 1690. In 1715 Samuel Clarke wrote, "Consciousness . . . signifies . . . the reflex act by which I know that I think and that my thoughts and acts are my own and not another's." (197-98)

This piece of historical etymology is, to say the very least, under-argued. The joint sense is: X and Y are both conscious of Z. Dewey's "reduplication" would yield: X (as thinker) and X (as agent) are (both) conscious of Z. Is the relationship between X as thinker and X as agent analogous to that between two distinct individuals? Does it somehow derive from the case of X and Y sharing knowledge of something that one of them does? Dewey offers us nothing to back up such conclusions. Natsoulas discusses Dewey's reduplication and comes to a somewhat equivocal conclusion. Neither gives us any reason to modify today's common sense conclusion that both as thinker and as agent, X knows of her own actions by private-access consciousness.

Natsoulas acknowledges that the central senses are the third and fourth, which, as I noted earlier, OED1does not clearly differentiate ("in same sense, without to oneself"). The fourth sense of 'consciousness', backed up by quotations in Cudworth (1678) and Locke (1690), both earlier than South, is closely related to one of the two dominant contemporary philosophical senses -- a "condition and concomitant of all thought, feeling, and volition". This is the private-access consciousness that characterizes occurrent thoughts of which we are aware in a distinctively self-knowing way. Hume writes of impressions and ideas making their way into "thought or consciousness;" Thomas Nagel's formula "what it is like" is an attempt to characterize consciousness of this sort. Let's call this "phenomenal" consciousness. It is different from "reflective consciousness," the awareness that a conscious thought is one's own. Animals are phenomenally conscious; but only higher animals (perhaps only humans) ascribe thoughts to themselves. Note that phenomenal consciousness is the more basic of these two, for it is that which is self-ascribed in reflective consciousness.

OED1errs twice with regard to reflective consciousness. First, it lumps consciousness-of with a more encompassing knowledge-of -- consciousness of one's own personal qualities, for example. For in the third sense of 'conscious,' Locke's 1690 "that a Man is always conscious to himself of thinking" is given alongside Burke's 1779 "If I were not conscious to myself of having done everything in my power." Burke's usage is equivalent simply to 'know' -- "if I did not know that I had done everything in my power" -- though in the instance, it is self-knowledge that is involved. Why does OED1distinguish being conscious of one's own actions from being conscious of another's? It is unclear that Murray's taxonomy of the word can carry the burden of this distinction.

Secondly, OED1conflates phenomenal consciousness with reflective consciousness. For it equates the "philosophical" fourth sense of 'consciousness,' i.e., the "concomitant of all thought, feeling and volition," with "the recognition by the thinking subject of its own acts or affections" (a formula taken from William Hamilton). As noted earlier, the latter is different from phenomenal consciousness; it is a substantial philosophical thesis to hold that the two are the same.

It seems to me that these two senses of 'conscious' are quite sufficient for philosophical purposes. It isn't clear, for example, that the fifth OED1sense (the totality of conscious thought at a time in a thinker) and the sixth (the normal condition of healthy waking life) add anything new. But since OED1 does not clearly distinguish the central senses and also includes irrelevant others, it is unclear what purpose is served by Natsoulas's excursus into historical lexicography. Of course, it could be argued that the unity and clarity of the philosopher's term is illusory. This, certainly, was Dewey's point: the distinctively philosophical use "begs as many metaphysical problems as is likely ever to be the privilege of any one word," he says (1906, 41); it is "a peculiar combination" of several others (1906, 40). But Dewey was whistling in the dark: perhaps it is a "peculiar combination," but the explanation could be that it seizes on something important that is common to these other uses. Dewey overlooks this; he thinks that there is a danger of equivocation in the philosopher's use. Of course, he offers no argument for this; Murray's taxonomy is presented as sealing the case. Natsoulas's approach to Murray is considerably more nuanced. Nevertheless, I found it unclear how much this framework aids the analytic project.

As mentioned earlier, Natsoulas denies that the objects of our conscious awareness are internal conscious events. He has no sympathy with Cartesian ideas, sense-data, virtual objects, and so on -- these internal events and entities are not what we perceive; rather the world outside is what we perceive, and without the intermediary of a realm of mental objects. On the other hand, he is not a naïve realist. (Unfortunately, Natsoulas is not quite as explicit about the difference between "direct" and naïve realism as one would have hoped.) It comes as no surprise, therefore, to find that he takes up an "intentionalist" perspective -- that he holds, in other words, that perceptual states have meanings that take external real-world facts as their reference or extension. It is this (broadly Husserlian) perspective that he brings to Gibson's worldview. (Natsoulas credits David Woodruff Smith for his interpretation of Husserl [303]; following Dagfinn Føllesdal, Woodruff Smith likens Husserl's noema, the meaning of a perceptual state, to Frege's sense.)

Gibson held that organisms comprehend their surroundings in terms of their own possibilities for action, in terms of "affordances," to use his terminology. Natsoulas sees in this form of perception a moulding of consciousness to external reality; thus, he proposes that Gibson's ecological viewpoint offers us an understanding of the structure of consciousness itself. To put it somewhat differently, Gibson's project of understanding how perception helps us act on the environment serves, in Natsoulas, as the foundation for a transcendental understanding of consciousness itself. Perceptual experience is not, as the empiricists hold, an independent entity from which external reality is contingently inferred. Rather, it is constitutively informative about external events. Its meaning is not super-added, but intrinsic and essential. This relationship that perceptual awareness bears to the external world is thus "proposed to belong internally to each occurrence of ours of perceptual awareness. . . . [It is not because] such an awareness is causally, intentionally, or otherwise related to the segment of the ecological environment that is being perceived." (241) Consciousness is, in its immanent nature, awareness of "the life-world" (214), or, what comes down to much the same thing, of Gibsonian affordances.

This is an important philosophical insight. But how complete is it as an account of perceptual consciousness? Consider a secondary quality such as colour. Undoubtedly, it is extremely important to realize that colour perception helps us get on in the world by giving us access to ecological properties: yellow cheese is good to eat, yellow cheese superficially flecked with grey-green has the affordance only of being tossed into the garbage can. This is the kind of information that colour vision opens us up to; learning how to recognize healthy cheese manifests its utility. Nonetheless, there are qualities of conscious colour experience that arise more from our own qualities as perceiving subjects than from features of the external world of wavelength-differentiated light.

Consider the opposition of blue and yellow -- no colour is both bluish and yellowish. This is not a fact about ecological colours per se, but about how ecological colours are encoded and presented in perceptual consciousness. There is no fact of physics or of affordance that the opposition between blue and yellow reflects. Other organisms may not see the world in the same way -- they may not, as we do, experience colours as arrayed in the blue-yellow dimension -- but their way of seeing it might ecologically be just as valid as ours. Natsoulas's remarks about colour do not address questions like this, about the range of colour representations that serve different organisms, and consequently about the limited utility of a conception that matches internal awareness with external reality. "According to Husserl . . . color sensation . . . naturally corresponds to . . . color of the perceived surface" (301). Natsoulas rightly insists that external colour is not identical with the content of colour perception, but beyond this elementary remark, he says nothing about the content of colour representation.

Again, consider pleasure. The "diesel" overtone of a fine Rheingau Riesling is pleasurable to many. Intensify that quality and let it predominate: the pleasure vanishes. Why? What is it in the flavour of the Riesling that corresponds to this change of conscious response? A fatty slice of seared pork belly is lip-smackingly attractive; on the fifth helping, its blubberiness becomes nauseating. In each of these cases, it isn't the external world, but the internal qualities of perceptual experience that determine the character of consciousness. There are qualities of conscious experience that cannot be understood from the outside in. Natsoulas's remarks about pain are restricted to the observation that, in the case of phantom limbs, "awareness of one's body is in part erroneous" but is still "an instance of ofness or aboutness" (281). Here, his single-minded focus on questions of correspondence blur out broader questions about roles other than truth-telling that perceptual consciousness can play.

It is in this context that Natsoulas makes what are to my mind some confusing remarks about objectivity and the sciences. At the centre of his perspective is the idea that science cannot escape the "life-world." Physics, he says following Husserl, is "an understanding of the surrounding world of life, the same world that we would still exclusively be perceiving" (224). (There are, incidentally, striking parallels, as well as differences, between Husserl's notion of life-world, or Lebenswelt, and the surrounding world, or Umwelt, of the German biologist, Jakob von Uexküll [1957/1934]. Husserl often uses the second term, following Heidegger in this case. See Beyer [2013, section 7] who does not mention von Uexküll.)

There are two strands in this line of thought that Natsoulas doesn't keep sufficiently separate. The first of these is that the "world" of physics is the same as the world that we live in and perceive. Obviously, this is true. I swim in the sea; I stand firm on the hard rocky coast. In neither case do I just fall through to the centre of the Earth. Why not? In terms of the life-world, it is because the rock is hard and because my swimming motions counteract the relative permeability of water. Physics gives us the gist of what this comes to in the end. It is this very sea and this very rock that the physicist describes in terms of intra-molecular forces and the like. There is obviously no ontological gulf between the physicist's world and the one I perceive and in which I act. Husserl suggests that the life-world is personally or socially constructed, and I take it that Natsoulas disagrees.

On the other hand, Natsoulas wants to say that physicists' concepts could not, and ought not to, transcend the subject-bound perspective of perception. In other words (as I take him), theories about forces, masses and movements are ultimately about such things as my swimming in the sea and standing on the rocky shore. Here, as far as I can tell, he fallaciously argues, following Husserl, that because physicists are human beings who operate in the life-world, physical concepts cannot tear themselves loose from this life-world. (Natsoulas does essay some rather obscure qualifications to Husserl; on the whole, however, he seems to agree.) "World-experiencing and world-theorizing are human activities that proceed in within an already existing world, the life-world" (229). "Research within the life-world . . . is about the life-world" (230).

This seems wrong to me. Contemporary physics is not at bottom an attempt to understand ordinary perceivable facts. Of course, there is a presumption that it does somehow reveal the ultimate causal basis of such facts. Nevertheless, physicists are focussed not on everyday perceived facts, but on experimental results produced with the aid of extremely costly apparatus. The physicist seeks to explain the results produced by the large hadron collider at CERN, and though her theories must somehow apply to quotidian facts, such as how we propel ourselves forward in the water or stand still on hard rocky beaches, physicists do not typically write papers about the latter kind of fact, or make any serious effort to quantify them in a sufficiently precise way to enable scientific understanding. (Is this even possible?) We might understand in broad terms what forces are at work when we stand still on hard rock; however, the precision of scientific observation cannot be brought to bear on such.

Nor does this constitute any kind of "crisis of the European sciences." It is quite right and proper that physics should operate independently of everyday life. Physics tells us of reality that is distant from everyday observation. The physicist's experiments test extremely precise predictions about circumstances that are totally unconnected to everyday experience. Contrary to Husserl's notion, the connection between physics and everyday pre-theoretical activities is extremely indirect at best. The physicist may have to use her eyes and her hands during the course of performing experiments at CERN; it does not follow that her experiments are epistemically founded on, or in any sense "about," these perceptual or bodily abilities.

This is a book from which I learned a great deal, primarily about the development of a certain tradition in the philosophy of perception, but also about perception itself. In the end, it arrives at conclusions about perceptual consciousness that are closely reminiscent of Føllesdal's Husserl -- not at all a bad place to end up. As hinted above, though, I am dubious about the treatment of hallucination: intentionalism has no need to rest on such ad hoc empirical claims as that hallucination always "resembles" veridical perception. There are parts that I found very difficult to understand the nuance -- the chapter on "Experiential Presence" is an example -- even where the broad thrust was clear enough. There are other parts, particularly the chapter on "The Life-World" that I found fresh and revelatory. It's not a small undertaking, but I feel glad I took it on and completed it.


I am grateful to Donald Ainslie and Cheryl Misak for discussing and fact-checking my discussion of the OED senses of 'conscious,' especially as it relates to the history of philosophy.


Beyer, Christian (2013). "Edmund Husserl", Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Dewey, John (1906). "The Terms 'Conscious' and 'Consciousness'," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 3: 39-41.

Tawney, G. A. (1911). "Consciousness in Psychology and Philosophy," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 8: 197-203.

Von Uexküll, Jakob (1957/1934). "A Stroll Through the Worlds of Animals and Men: A Picture Book of Invisible Worlds" (illustrated by G. Kriszat), tr. C. Schiller, in Claire H. Schiller (ed.) Instinctive Behavior: The Development of a Modern Concept. New York: International Universities Press. Originally Streifzüge durch die Umwelten von Tieren und Menschen. Berlin: Springer.