Consciousness and Subjectivity

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Sofia Miguens and Gerhard Preyer (eds.), Consciousness and Subjectivity, Ontos, 2012, 363pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381368.

Reviewed by Robert Howell, Southern Methodist University


Increasingly, philosophers have realized there are valuable lessons to be learned from both "analytic" and "continental" approaches to philosophical problems. This has become particularly fruitful in the areas of consciousness and subjectivity, where pivotal work has been done by phenomenologists and philosophers in the post-Kantian tradition. This volume consists of an introduction and fourteen papers that attempt to benefit from this synthesis. While the papers share more of a family-resemblance than they do a clearly delineated theme, all of them have the refreshing approach of taking seriously the first-person perspective on the self and consciousness. Because of the lack of unity, however, and some unevenness in the quality of the papers, I would be hard pressed to recommend the book as a text for a graduate seminar. Nevertheless, specialists in this sub-discipline will definitely benefit from reading a number of papers.

The volume opens with an introduction by the editors, which motivates the idea of the anthology with the idea that there are "blindspots" which have arisen due to a lack of mesh between the two philosophical traditions. These blindspots derive from hewing too consistently to a third-person point of view on the mind.

Hilary Putnam, who along with Dieter Henrich is a stated inspiration for the volume, opens with "Sensation and Apperception," consisting of reflections on McDowell's Mind and World. According to McDowell, the possibility of having sensory experience depends upon having certain conceptual capacities. This Putnam now finds mysterious. Among other things, it seems one can have novel sensations for which we have no concepts, and we can (using short term memory) find unconceptualized sensations. Putnam suggests a middle way, between a McDowellian view and the view (perhaps wrongly) associated with Evans according to which sensations are merely causal triggers for beliefs. Sensations are unconceptualized, but apperception is conceptual. Apperception has a rich history, but Putnam emphasizes that it involves a sort of recognition of what one is perceiving (or even that one is perceiving), it can rationally justify beliefs, and it can be incorrect and contradicted by belief. This apperceptive layer can then serve as the "tribunal" for beliefs that McDowell seeks.

There is something plausible in what Putnam says and in the distinction he makes. But if one is really convinced that unconceptualized sensations cannot rationalize judgments, why would they rationalize apperceptive states? There is still a move from something that is neither justified nor unjustified to something that is. It's unclear how introducing a third state helps matters.

Elija Chudnoff's enlightening contribution provides an account of "presentational phenomenology," the particular sort of phenomenology that we have, for example, when the world presents itself to us as in perception. Chudnoff argues that "What it is for an experience to have presentational phenomenology with respect to p is for it to both represent that p and make it seem as if you are aware of a truth-maker for p." To use an example from perception, with respect to the proposition "there is a red stoplight ahead" one has presentational phenomenology when one perceptually represents that there is a red stoplight ahead, and one also seems to see a red stoplight. These two features of presentational phenomenology are non-trivially connected since one can perceptually represent that there is a red light ahead without thereby seeming to see a red stoplight. (This can happen when one sees the halo of the light without seeing the stoplight itself.) He then makes a compelling case that this sort of thing can be found not only in perception, but also in intuition, introspection, recollection, and imagination. He then argues that one can build an account of justification and knowledge using these notions.

Though Chudnoff considers a few objections, dismissing them requires his view (defended in Chudnoff (2011)) that knowledge can occur in virtue of p even if p is not a sufficient condition for knowledge. That's a pill to swallow, but a few other issues arise. One might doubt, for example, that you can really perceptually represent that p without your seeming to be aware of a truth-maker that p. In the occluded stoplight case, for example, I'm more inclined to say that you are not perceiving that there is a stoplight but that there is a reddish halo, and thereby holding a belief that there is a stoplight. But if the two conditions don't come apart, it's not clear that the analysis of presentational phenomenology is very informative, or that the resulting views about justification are much of an advance beyond dogmatism.

Michelle Montague provides a phenomenologically motivated picture of the intentional contents of perception. Arguing against the Fregean picture of Chalmers and Thompson, and the representationalist view of Tye and Dretske, she defends a Brentanian approach grounded in the idea that all awareness is awareness of awareness. She argues that the content of the experience is anything one is aware of in the experience, and this includes the awareness itself. In perceptual experience, one is attributing "the property whose essential introspective character I take to be partly revealed in the qualitative character of the experience." (84) The attributing occurs because "an aspect of the redness sensation resembles an aspect of the redness attributed to the object, and it is in virtue of this resemblance that the experience attributes redness to the ball." (85)

Here there are problems with the account as well as problems with the dialectic. Montague claims that "Contrary to Standard Representationalism, the property attributed to the object is internally linked to the phenomenological property we are aware of in having an experience." In fact this does not conflict with representationalism, even as Montague characterizes it. Also, on Montague's account it seems that when you experiences red you are experiencing "two reds" -- the red of the experience and the red of the object, and it is the resemblance between the two reds that allows you to represent the other. There are two problems. First, there simply don't seem to be two reds when you see a red ball. Second, resemblance can't be enough. For suppose you see two red balls, a and b. Presumably the internal red a' that represents a resembles b just as much. But a' doesn't represent a and b and there is no confusion about which it does represent.

Donovon Wishon's contribution aims to provide an account of perception that combines direct realism with a highest-common-factor view of perception. He does this by extending John Perry's (2002) account of informational content to account for perceptual content. Because of its dependence on Perry's view, which is itself somewhat complicated, it is a little difficult to see the contours of Wishon's own view. The view seems to be that there are internal "signals," which in perception I take to be something like sensations, that carry information about objects in the external world. They do this because, given background constraints, those signals are present iff something in the world is the case.

In general, one would like to see this view situated against other views in the literature, for example the Fodorian co-variation views and the Fregean views of Chalmers and Thompson. This would help make the view clear, and it would help us to see in what sense we really have direct realism. Wishon claims this view counts as a case of direct realism: "This is because the informational content of a signal is literally about the very external objects . . . it has the job of indicating." (100) But just because a subject has a state which is directly about an external object doesn't mean that the subject is directly perceiving the object -- that state could be an intermediary.

Uriah Kriegel argues that extant theories of mental representation are inadequate because they (at best) only account for sub-personal representational processes but wholly ignore the personal level of representation. He takes Dretske's account as his main target, but his focus is on the way traditional views have ontological, semantic and methodological tenets that are different from a first-personal project. The ontological tenet is that representation is a two-place relation (x represents y), the semantic tenet is that the right account is information theoretic, and the methodological tenet is that mental representations are posited only on third-personal grounds. While I am not sure Kriegel is right about the first two tenets, I am inclined to think he is right about the third, and Kriegel is part of a band (including Nagel, Searle, Loar, Siewart, Pitt, Gertler, and most of the authors in this volume) who are rightfully pushing back on this tenet.

Kriegel offers an interesting account of the personal/sub-personal distinction. Here I have some quibbles. He argues that "a mental state S (or process P) of a subject Z is a personal level state (or process) just in case Z is simultaneously at least minimally aware of S (or P)." (124) The most obvious worry about this account is that Kriegel uses dorsal stream representations as paradigm cases of sub-personal representations, but his own example suggests that the subject is aware of the content of the representation (the size of a circle in Titchener's illusion, for example), and given his embrace of the transparency of experience, being aware of a representation is nothing more than being aware of the content. The natural move (which Kriegel seems to make) is to say that this is a sub-personal awareness. But now the account is circular -- a representational state is personal only if one has personal awareness of it.

Charles Travis' contribution aims to provide an explanation of Moore-paradoxical statements by providing an account of belief in terms of one's being forced to take a stand on the way things are. Moore-paradoxical statements would require that one see oneself as having no option but to think things are a certain way while simultaneously recognizing that there are options. I have doubts about this solution to the puzzle. Suppose doxastic voluntarism were true. Would Moore-paradoxical statements no longer be strange? I think they would, because the problem is not that when one believes that p one is forced to see the world as p-ish, but that one does as a matter of fact see it that way. It is the seeing it that way (or the statement that one sees it that way) which is in tension with the statement that it is not that way. Force doesn't seem to have much to do with it.

Manfred Frank's paper distinguishes between two notions of subjectivity: self consciousness, which is a property of mental states that by nature present themselves; and self-knowledge, which involves knowing oneself in a particularly first personal way. While clear, the article mostly provides a brief canvassing of the types of arguments offered about phenomenal consciousness and first-person "essential" indexicality. Though there is not much new here, Frank's perspective is valuable because of his synthesis of both the "analytic" and "continental" traditions, bringing together insights from Fichte to Perry.

Frank's claim is that "subjectivity in both its varieties cannot be reduced to either objects or facts." While he does point to the beginnings of arguments to this end, and these beginnings are worth discussing, he is far from establishing his argument. Still, Frank is right to see a connection between these two problems and his article provides a good starting point for further thought on the topic.

Gerhard Preyer's contribution tries to familiarize readers with some of the views of Dieter Henrich, a very influential German philosopher who has yet to receive much notice in Anglo-American philosophy. Though the terrain here is rough-going -- in part due to grammatical errors and typos which should have been caught by the editors -- the paper makes me wish more of Henrich's work was translated into English. Henrich is concerned with squaring the apparent inconsistencies between a third-personal view of the world and the irresistible first-person perspective. The emphasis here is on "primary self-consciousness" which is pre-conceptual, immediate knowledge of oneself, and self-determination, which seems to be in conflict with the fact of determinism.

Neil Feit defends a Lewisian account of de se attitudes from several objections. On this account, beliefs consist in self-ascriptions of properties. Although Feit makes the right moves in his responses, there seems to be a bit of a tension between two of them. In response to the claim that self-ascription is something we lack a grasp of, he points to our very natural understanding of what it is for someone to believe herself to be a certain way. If we understand this, according to him, we can understand self-ascription. But when answering another objection -- that it doesn't seem we self-ascribe in normal cases of belief -- Feit distinguishes between the robust notion of self-ascription and the self-ascription the property view requires. This suggests that the sense of self-ascription that we really understand is not the one really doing the work in the view. Nevertheless, in a field of views with many difficulties, Feit does a good job of breathing life into the self-ascription view.

Jocelyn Benoist's contribution at first appears to be a bit of an outlier, as it is largely a critique of Brandom's account of de re intentionality. The essence of his critique, however, is quite in keeping with the theme of the volume. Benoist argues that Brandom's attempt to capture de re thought through de re thought attributions fails, because it does not really capture the way in which thoughts can be de re independent of attributions. He emphasizes that Brandom basically disposes of the first-person point of view by viewing it as a construction from the third-personal project of interpretation.

Shaun Gallagher's contribution brings interesting disorders and case studies to bear on the first-person perspective and the role of Immunity to Error through Misidentification (IEM). Several cases are considered: the rubber hand illusions, schizophrenics who have delusions of thought insertion, Somatoparaphrenia, and the experience one has when controlling a robot's arms using one's own arm movements. None of these, Gallagher claims, threaten IEM.

While Gallagher has many good points and helpful distinctions when discussing these cases, I have a slight concern. He (and it appears his interlocutors as well) debate whether IEM fails, or whether there are exceptions to IEM. But if one is really talking about Shoemaker's distinction, this question is not well formed. It is judgments that are IEM, and they are IEM relative to a term in the judgment and relative to a particular judgmental source. So when one claims that IEM "fails," one must specify the precise judgment that is not IEM. This is more than a nitpick, I think, since some of Gallagher's defenses of IEM seem to consist in showing that in the problematic scenarios there is some judgment in the neighborhood that is IEM. But that doesn't show that this is the relevant judgment in the case. When Evans and others debate whether "My legs are crossed" is IEM when based on proprioception, they will not be vindicated if it can be shown that "I seem to feel my legs crossed" is IEM.

Thor Grünbaum's article, like several others in the volume, is in support of the thesis that all consciousness involves a form of self-consciousness or "me-ness." The article stands out, however, for being very explicit about what me-ness involves, and for offering a novel argument for the existence of this "minimal self-consciousness." Grünbaum argues that truly first-personal self-reference (of the "essential indexical" sort) depends on the existence of this minimal self-consciousness, and that an "anonymous" view of consciousness cannot adequately explain such self-reference.

While the arguments here are not airtight, as Grünbaum readily admits, I found them quite interesting and rather persuasive. He argues convincingly against some obvious ways that the anonymous view can secure first-personal self-reference, and provides a story with a good deal of intuitive support for the role of "phenomenal understanding" in self-reference. There is some room for the anonymous view to maneuver, though. In particular, it seems possible to claim that conscious experiences don't figure into their own contents, but the subject nevertheless has epistemically robust access to the fact that she is having the experiences. Nevertheless, Grünbaum has definitely raised the bar for such a defense.

Krueger and Overgaard defend the thesis that we directly perceive other people's minds. We see it when someone is angry, and when someone intends to act we often see that as well. On their view, bodily behavior constitutes mental states by being a part of them -- your angry facial expression is part of your anger. They support this by appealing to numerous studies that point to ways in which behavior or lack of it reinforces or undermines mental states. (Smiling can make one feel happy, etc.)

Kreuger and Overgaard nicely combine the empirical, the phenomenological and the conceptual to make it plausible that when we "read other minds" we are not simply making inferences or constructing theories based on behavior. Whether or not this counts as direct perception will probably hinge upon issues surrounding the notion of perception and, perhaps more importantly, whether or not this story provides a unique epistemological payoff remains to be seen.

Williford, Rudrauf and Landini's contribution divides into two parts. The first provides a description of some of the fundamental phenomenological data about consciousness and subjectivity, and the second part provides a mathematical/geometrical model of that data. Although the presentation of the data is rather quick, and sometimes short on argument, it is rather insightful. The authors bring several features of consciousness to the fore -- such as the fact that it involves "facetless self-awareness" -- which have been noticed by Husserl and others, but are rarely clearly articulated. They then use such features to explain some of the puzzles of consciousness, such as the elusiveness of the self.

For me, the mathematical model is hard to follow, but I find myself unsure about the nature of the project. Resemblances between certain ways of describing consciousness and ways of describing self-referential sentences, Escher drawings, "strange loops," and non-standard geometries are suggestive. But one wonders how much content is in the model, and how much is being projected onto the model by the interpreter. For example, one wonders whether any such model might account for any number of ways things might appear just so long as one made adjustments in the "physics" that governs appearances in the model. It's not clear that one can make sense of there being a perspective in a model -- in the robust sense of "perspective" we mean when talking about consciousness -- without many additional assumptions.