Consciousness and the Limits of Objectivity: The Case for Subjective Physicalism

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Robert J. Howell, Consciousness and the Limits of Objectivity: The Case for Subjective Physicalism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 190pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199654666.

Reviewed by Richard Brown, LaGuardia Community College, CUNY


What happens when we take consciousness seriously? Howell argues that doing so requires giving up on objectivity but not on physicalism. The resulting view, which he calls 'subjective physicalism', is one on which consciousness is wholly physical but cannot be truly understood from an objective point of view. It can only be known from the inside, via acquaintance, and so there is a sense in which any objective picture of the physical world will be incomplete.

Howell's book is short, and there are places where things move a bit too quickly and others where one wishes more had been said. Still, overall he presents a clear account of how consciousness could be physical even if we can't fully know it from an objective standpoint. Howell shows that there is still much to be discussed in what might look like well-worn territory, and his book is deserving of attention.

In what follows I will suggest that there is a way to take consciousness seriously and keep objectivity and that this alternative view is preferable in the face of the rising challenge from Russellian monism, to which Howell's view is especially vulnerable. In doing so I will follow the structure of the book and focus first on his definition of physicalism, then his grappling with the subjective nature of the mental, and finally take a step back and offer some general remarks.

Howell offers the following definition of physicalism:

Physicalism is true iff the concrete properties and things in this world supervene upon the properties in this world that are exhausted by their implications for the distribution of things over space and time. (p. 53)

Unpacking this takes some work. First, Howell is only considering physicalism about the 'concrete properties and things' in this world and so is taking no stand on whether mathematics, justice, or other such properties are physical. Second, Howell invokes a specific notion of supervenience to characterize the relationship between the concrete objects in our world and the basic or fundamental physical properties.

We can start by looking at what Howell takes to be the basic physical properties. He offers an interesting update to Descartes' criteria for being physical. Descartes claimed that to be material was to be extended in space. This has some shortcomings in that contemporary physics seems to have accepted that there are non-extended physical things, fields and electrons are primary examples. Howell takes Descartes' basic idea to be that being physical is essentially bound up with the idea of being located in space and time, whether extended or not. He then proposes to update Descartes' claim to say that the physical can be exhaustively characterized in terms of the way that thing behaves in space over time, or the ways in which it puts constraints on the behavior of things in space and time. A magnetic field, for instance, has very specific mathematically defined consequences for what will happen when a charge is in its presence and what will happen when a similar charge is nearby, or an opposite one, etc. Furthermore, it is plausible that there is nothing more to being a field than can be stated in terms of spatial-temporal implications. The dualist denies this with respect to the mental and asserts that some of the world's properties are such that they cannot be exhaustively described in terms of their implications for behavior in spacetime. For instance, the painfulness of pain -- the pain quale -- cannot be exhaustively described in such terms since, no matter how much you talk about its spatial and temporal implications, that will leave out what it is like to feel the pain.

Howell considers the objection that there may be categorical bases that ground the causal powers he is talking about. He counters by showing that for each basic property we can construct what he calls  'Trans-World Disposition Sets' (TDS), which will allow that different properties may have different powers in different possible worlds. Physical properties then are the ones whose TDS are free from anything that cannot be exhaustively described in terms of spatial implications. So if phenomenal redness is the categorical base of charge and so confers all of the powers that charge does, it still cannot be exhaustively characterized in this way.

One nice feature of Howell's discussion is that he considers some of the consequences of string theory. From the tone of the discussion I suppose I am a bit more optimistic about string theory than Howell is, but even so I hope this is a trend that continues! Whatever one's ultimate views about the prospects for the theory, it contains much that is of philosophical interest. For instance, one very promising avenue of research in string theory seems to have the result that the spacetime we live in can be seen as emerging at a certain scale from a more fundamental 2-dimensional quantum field theory that does not have gravity or spacetime as it is in general relativity (this is related to the so-called 'holographic principle' which has been getting some attention recently). Howell is happy to accept that this may be the case and then to stipulate that the mental supervenes on the properties that are exhausted in terms of implications in the 2-dimensional quantum field.

The problem can be pushed further since string theory also seems to tell us that, below a certain level of scale, notions of space (of any kind), and maybe even time (!), completely break down and cease to make sense at all. Howell argues that even if something like this were true he could still say that the physical properties are the ones that can be exhaustively described in terms of the implications in the emergent 2D field (physical* properties), and that the mental supervenes on those properties. This would be strange, but even so physicalism, as Howell understands it, could still be true.

What if consciousness does not supervene (or whatever) on the quantum but rather on whatever it is that is underneath the quantum level? In this case, Howell says, physicalism is false. Why? Because

it would be an uncomfortable anomaly, on par with panpsychism or neutral monism, if psychological facts could not be fixed by the quantum (or what are now the lowest known level) facts but instead require a particular realization in the sub-quantum (p. 37)

Though I like Howell's definition in terms of spatial implication, I think that it is here that he actually puts his finger on what physicalists in the contemporary period care about. What matters to many physicalists is the claim that consciousness and mind, in all their majesty, really are in a way just like water, dirt, and stars. They are not one of the fundamental forces, features, or properties of the world but are rather built up out of that fundamental stuff in some way just like everything else is. Construed this way, physicalism is the claim that consciousness fits into the physical world in the way that other non-fundamental things do, and in particular in the way that other biological/neural/psychological things do. If brains supervene on quantum mechanics then so does consciousness, says the physicalist.

Though Howell seems to rely on this intuitive notion, his definition doesn't seem to capture it. On the one hand, what if the (possibly emergent) spacetime itself is conscious? This is a radical view but not impossible (perhaps dark energy is a clue!). If this is the case, then what Howell needs is not just any old space, but physical space (the very charge that Howell levels against David Chalmers' definition in terms of structure). On the other hand, we should not rule out the possibility that the physics beyond string theory, if there is one, might contain non-spatial or, perhaps more drastically, even non-temporal elements. Of course it is hard for us to imagine the physics that does so, but it was also hard for Descartes to imagine physics without extension!

A similar issue arises in Howell's account of supervenience. Inspired by Chalmers, he tells us (p. 43) that a set of properties, A, metaphysically supervenes on another set, B, when in any possible world where you duplicate B you get A as a proper part of whatever world you are considering. So, consider a world that is a physical duplicate of our world but that also has extra alien non-physical phenomenal properties that attach to roses in bloom. If physicalism as Howell construes it is true, then at that world duplicating the basic physics (all of the properties individuated via TDS and the laws governing those properties) should duplicate everything except the non-physical rose-consciousness. Our world, with its usual phenomenal consciousness, is a proper part of the rose-consciousness world.

Howell responds to the most common criticism of supervenience views, which is that the relation seems too weak and allows for worlds where physicalism is false to count as ones where physicalism is true (blocker worlds where non-physical entities block the physical from giving rise to consciousness) as well as worlds where dualism is true but get counted as ones where physicalism is true (worlds where consciousness is an emergent property). Blocker worlds are easily diagnosed as ones where physicalism is false, given Howell's definition of supervenience. Since they contain an extra non-physical element that blocks phenomenal consciousness those worlds do not contain our world as a proper part (phenomenal consciousness is missing there but not here).

Emergentism is a bit more complex. He argues that the supervenience relation can be strengthened by distinguishing nomological necessity from metaphysical necessity and defining emergent properties as those that supervene nomologically but not metaphysically. If so, his definition rules it out automatically since the mental metaphysically supervenes on the physical for Howell. Or, if one accepts necessitarianism about laws, then he argues that the properties from which the mental emerges are no longer purely physical since they can no longer be individuated solely by their implications for behavior in space and time.

I think this is the best version of the supervenience approach currently on the market, but I do think that there is a big problem for these kinds of approaches, which has been recently articulated by Barbara Montero (Montero forthcoming). In possible worlds where supervenience fails (say, the chemical properties don't supervene on the TDS properties) physicalism still seems like it could be true (e.g., a neural identity theory could still be true at that world). This is because consciousness could still fit into the world like the other concrete objects and their properties do.

I tend to think that we can intuitively make sense of the idea that there is some mind independent way that the world is and that there is some idealized theory that fully captures and explains those facts, and that if we need to explicitly include mental properties in that theory, then physicalism will have lost an important battle (though I also tend to think that at that point whether you call the resulting mental properties physical or not is mostly a verbal issue). The reason for this is that there is a good case to be made that consciousness would be the only thing that could not be fully incorporated into the objective worldview produced by physical science. Thus, even if, in some sense, we got to say that consciousness was physical, giving this up would still give aid and comfort to the dualist.

It is not clear that Howell's subjective physicalism wins the above battle. To see why let us turn to the second part of the book where he discusses the challenge of the subjective.

Howell begins with the knowledge argument, which he formulates as follows:

1.     There are truths that are not deducible from the physical truths, namely, those that Mary learns when she leaves the black and white room.

2.     If there are truths that are not deducible from the physical truths there are truths that are not necessitated by, and so do not supervene on, the physical truths.

Therefore physicalism is false. (p. 60)

Those who reject the first premise Howell calls 'hardliners', though the rest of us might recognize them as the type-A physicalists. These people typically claim that Mary could know what it is like to see red from within her room. Those who reject the second premise are what Howell calls the epistemecists, which again will be familiar to many as type-B physicalists. This group is unified by the claim that Mary's new knowledge reveals an epistemic limit or specialness about consciousness without revealing any metaphysical specialness. Subjective physicalism is ultimately an interesting version of type-B physicalism, and Howell is very clear that he intends to keep epistemic considerations separate from metaphysical ones.

Howell argues that all current responses to the knowledge argument either end up endorsing the hardline position or end up positing a kind of acquaintance. There is much of interest in Howell's discussion of the individual responses, and I find his arguments plausible. Since, like him, I don't find the hardline option plausible, I will focus on the notion of acquaintance and the problem Howell thinks it causes for objectivity.

Acquaintance for Howell gives us a kind of knowledge of our own consciousness that could not in principle be had from any objective third-person perspective. Because of this Howell thinks that acquaintance requires that we give up on objectivity and completeness, but what are these properties? Howell considers a theory complete when, "an ideal reasoner who fully grasped the theory could not conceive of more than one world (possible or impossible) that the theory could be about" (p. 94).

A theory is objective when one does not need to occupy any states in order to fully grasp it. So when Mary is in her room she has an objective theory that exhausts the metaphysical facts, but it is not complete. According to Howell she can still conceive of zombies and inverts. When she leaves her room and sees red she then 'occupies consciousness' and for the first time fully understands what she was studying in her room. Howell therefore concludes that acquaintance is incompatible with an objective theory of the world. If a theory is objective, then one does not need to occupy any particular states to fully grasp it. Yet acquaintance says that to fully grasp facts about consciousness we need to occupy mental states.

But one may argue that when Mary gets the appropriate phenomenal concepts, she will be in a position to deduce the phenomenal facts from the physical facts. If so, then a case can be made that the physical theory is objective and complete after all. No one expects that Mary can deduce that water is H2O without the concept WATER, why should consciousness be any different? Howell rejects this line of thought (p. 75), but it is not clear why he does so. He says, in a footnote, that the conceivability arguments against physicalism in essence make this point, and he points to Chalmers and Torin Alter making similar points, but none of this establishes the point. I have the very strong intuition that once Mary has acquired the relevant phenomenal concepts, and the abilities that these concepts ground, she would be able to deduce phenomenal facts from the physical facts. And if these concepts played merely an enabling role rather than a justifying role in the deduction, then the physical theory is in principle objective and complete. An ideal reasoner with all the relevant concepts and the complete objective theory could deduce phenomenal facts from physical facts without occupying any phenomenal states.

I have elsewhere defended this kind of view (Brown 2010), but, as noted above, Howell rejects this move, and I think it is instructive to wonder why he does so. We can approach the question by asking whether Mary would still be able to conceive of zombies once she sees red? Howell says, "Mary does not discover a new property, but she does learn about a property in such a way that it allows her to rule out a set of 'scenarios' that seemed to her consistent with what she had already learned" (p. 156).

This makes it sound as though Howell thinks that once Mary sees red she then comes to have a complete (in his sense) theory about red. This sounds an awful lot like the claim that she comes to be able to see which of the things she previously thought were possible really are in fact true metaphysical possibilities. But how does she do this if it isn't deduction? Howell does not say, but my guess is that he might say that Mary would appeal to the kinds of reasons (or their relatives) that he considers, so let us continue with the argument and come back to this issue.

Howell next turns to the presentation argument of Max Black and the conceivability argument offered by Chalmers. The presentation argument proceeds by pointing out that we seem to identify our conscious experiences in virtue of a property, perhaps the property of what it is like to have the experience, and that does not seem like a physical property. The conceivability argument invokes the conceivability of physical duplicates that lack consciousness. Howell sees in both a commitment to a certain view about the way in which properties (and possible worlds) are individuated, which he calls 'intensionalism'.

In response to the presentation argument, Howell accepts that the properties we are acquainted with present themselves in a way that makes them seem like they are not physical states but then objects that this will only get you dualism if you think that properties are distinct when they cannot be identified a priori. His main complaint is that whether two properties are identical or not is a metaphysical issue and intensionalism is an epistemic notion. Appeals to idealized versions of intensionalism may get at the metaphysics, but Howell complains that they are inherently vague.

In the case of the zombie argument, he objects to the claim that everything that is conceivable is possible. He argues that one can make sense of the notion that there are fewer metaphysically possible worlds than there are ways that we can conceive of things. Acquaintance explains how this is the case for him. Since consciousness can only be known about from the inside, or from a point of view, any theory that is completely objective will leave open various epistemic possibilities like zombies and inverts, but if physicalism is true, then in every metaphysically possible world it will be the case that the mental supervenes on the basic physical properties.

Zombie worlds will not be metaphysically possible because phenomenal redness and all other phenomenal 'properties' are really aspects of certain physical states for Howell. He does not say much about what an aspect is, but he is clear that it is the kind of thing that is metaphysically tied to the physical state. We can conceptually distinguish the phenomenal aspect from the physical aspect of various states, but they cannot even possibly come apart. The physical properties as Howell envisions them would not be the properties that they are without these subjective aspects. Yet, since there is no explanation for why red should be an aspect of this physical state rather than that one, consciousness looks like an anomaly.

So, if we are convinced by Howell's argument, why should we be physicalists? These mental aspects certainly seem close to non-physical qualia (in fact one wonders if they threaten the physicality of the base properties. Can the base properties really be fully characterized in terms of spatial implications if that leaves out this crucial metaphysically necessary aspect of that property? I am not sure). Throughout the book Howell puts a lot of emphasis on mental causation. In particular he stresses the role that conscious experience seems to play in grounding our knowledge about our own mental life. Howell complains that if consciousness has no causal role to play in how we know about it, then it looks like we are cut off from it and this is a deal breaker. One gets the distinct feeling that, according to Howell, if Mary were wondering whether or not the epistemic possibility of zombies was truly metaphysically possible, considerations about mental causation would figure heavily in her reasoning and would convince her to favor physicalism.

Howell repeatedly claims that panpsychism is committed to epiphenomenalism, and it is true that in Chalmers' original work he was more open to epiphenomenalism. However it has become clear that this is too quick. Russellian panpsychism, or more generally Russellian monism in its current form (Chalmers forthcoming) claims that microphenomenal consciousness (or something closely related to it) is a fundamental feature of reality that grounds all of the causal powers of the physical world. If microphenomenal properties (or properties closely related to them) ground the roles of charges, mass, etc., then phenomenal consciousness has causal relevance, and so do the things that they constitute. Thus, if the brain is composed out of the elements described by physics, and if those things are constituted by microphenomenal properties (or properties closely related to them), then mental properties will play causal roles in brain functioning. So if the only reason to prefer Howell's version of physicalism is preservation of mental causation, then there is a serious challenge on the horizon: when fully on the table, why would (post-release) Mary prefer subjective physicalism to Russellian monism? Of course panpsychism has its own problems, but I do think that many philosophers have yet to fully grapple with a mature contemporary version of panpsychism and the challenge it presents.

Howell predicts that when physicalists realize the consequences of taking consciousness seriously as he sees it (accepting acquaintance and rejecting objectivity), many will prefer eliminativism (p. 2). After all, subjective physicalism, as Howell recognizes, comes dangerously close to claiming that consciousness is a fundamental and basic part of reality, unlike anything else that we find in the natural world. This violates what may be a core commitment of contemporary physicalism. Howell shows that if we are careful we can preserve physicalism, but as we have seen, it is not clear that we get anything for accepting the costs associated with the view.

So what would Mary do? I doubt she would take eliminativism seriously, nor would she become a panpsychist. My feeling is that she would indeed opt for physicalism precisely because she would be able to make the requisite deductions after acquiring the appropriate concepts. That is assuming that she could make the relevant deductions in the case of water, mountains, fire, neurons, life, etc., which I find at least prima facie plausible. This allows us to say that she could not do so in her room, or more generally, without acquiring the relevant concepts and the abilities they ground (whether that is done by acquaintance or not) while recognizing that a completed and objective physical theory is indeed a complete account of reality.

But, of course, before Mary will be able to decide this issue she awaits a complete (and maybe even true) theory of (at least) physics, biology, neuroscience, computation, linguistics, psychology, sociology, and phenomenology, as well as any auxiliary theories needed to make sense of these theories and the relations between them. So while it may be useful to think about what could happen at the end of inquiry, should such a day ever come, we should not forget that, despite all the progress we have made, in many ways we are still at the beginning. And one can't help but feel that here, as with most things, getting there will be most of the fun.


Brown, R. (2010) "Deprioritizing the A Priori Arguments against Physicalism" Journal of Consciousness Studies 17(3-4): 47-69.

Chalmers, D. J. (forthcoming) "Panpsychism and Panprotopsychism". 

Montero, B. G. (forthcoming) "Irreverent Physicalism" Philosophical Topics.