Consciousness and the Philosophy of Signs: How Peircean Semiotics Combines Phenomenal Qualia and Practical Effects

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​Marc Champagne, Consciousness and the Philosophy of Signs: How Peircean Semiotics Combines Phenomenal Qualia and Practical Effects, Springer, 2018, 127pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319733371.

Reviewed by Vincent M. Colapietro, Pennsylvania State University/University of Rhode Island


In a compact monograph, Marc Champagne makes large claims and indeed undertakes what might seem to some readers a Herculean task--to solve the "hard problem", as the problem of qualia has come to be identified in the philosophy of mind. In order to explain both phenomenal qualities and practical effects, Thomas Nagel suggests we need to respond creatively to the challenge of forming new concepts and devising a new method.[1] He identifies this with "an objective phenomenology not dependent on empathy or imagination." Moreover, Nagel assumes that such a resource, "if it exists, lies in the distant future" (quoted by Champagne). In contrast, Champagne judges it to be already present in the past, for "the materials needed to assemble a robust account of consciousness already exist in Peircean semiotics". In endeavoring to assemble these materials ito a coherent position possessing contemporary relevance, he realizes that his task will be "part history of philosophy, part current philosophy, and--hopefully--part future of philosophy as well" (p. 3).

It might seem that a pragmatist or pragmatically oriented philosopher would not hesitate to countenance functions but have little or no use for qualia. Regarding Peirce, this is, as Champagne rightly stresses, not at all the case. (In fact, it is also not the case with regard to either William James or John Dewey, both of whom were thoroughgoing champions of qualitative immediacy.[2]) Indeed, Peirce was as unabashedly committed to doing justice to the qualitative dimensions of human experience as he was rigorously engaged in identifying the cognitive functions fulfilled by affective states and processes. By drawing upon the resources in Peirce's semiotics (i.e., theory of signs) and indeed other parts of his philosophy (e.g., his phenomenology), Champagne imagines he can illuminate questions of not only sapience but also sentience, ones pertaining not only to cognitive functioning but also what it feels like to be mindfully engaged with the world (including mindfully engaged with one's own mind). While the activity of signs (or to use Peirce's word, semiosis) provides him with the means for making sense out of sapience, the presence of qualia in the universe allegedly allows him to offer an uncompromisingly experiential account of the feel of human consciousness.

The nub of his argument is that an embrace of immediate qualities does not entail abandonment of scientific rigor. Champagne insists that qualities are not inherently mysterious or anomalous, except on questionable and indeed avoidable presuppositions. The ineliminable role qualities play in our mental life deserves theoretical recognition and nothing in a scientific approach to rigorous theorizing warrants making an invincible mystery of what is, after all, an utter commonplace. In our experience, the aroma of coffee can be an arresting and absorbing affair, so much so that one is, in effect, transported into a mental state in which the quality, in itself, apart from all else, becomes the exclusive focus of our felt experience (in such an instance, whatever the physiological mechanism by which the aroma from the coffee reaches our olfactory senses, even whatever gives rise to this aroma, are eclipsed by our consciousness of the quality). In some places, Peirce identifies such a state of consciousness as monadic,[3] since the presence of the quality is so commanding that it effectively obliterates the sense of otherness (or what he calls secondness) characteristic of our waking consciousness. This state is that of a reverie or dream in which there is not even the minimal sense of otherness entailed by a contrast between (or among) qualities. Just as a single, unvarying tone might be sounded for an indefinite duration, so a single, ineffable quality might be felt for such a time. The musical analogy is one deployed by Peirce himself.

A single tone may be prolonged for an hour or a day, and it exists as perfectly in each second of that time as in the whole taken together; so that, as long as it is sounding, it might be present to a sense from which everything in the past was as completely absent as the future itself. (EP 1, 128; CP 5.395[4])

The experience of hearing the tone might be one in which the quality being heard is so absorbing as to extinguish any consciousness of the duration of the experience: the present, ordinarily an affair in which traces of the past and anticipations of the future provide the present with its texture no less than direction, becomes in such an instance a self-contained moment (albeit a "moment" of varying duration), seemingly suspended from the flow of time. The experience of hearing a melody however stands in sharp contrast to that of hearing a single, unvarying tone in the sense just described. It is irreducibly a temporal experience, in which before and after, even beginning, middle, and end, are integral simply to the process of hearing the melody as a melody. "Thought is," Peirce suggested in "How to Make Our Ideas Clear" (1878), "a thread of melody running through the succession of our sensations" (EP 1, 129; CP 5.395) or feelings.[5] In part, this means that thought is a process of mediation in which the presence of whatever immediately felt qualities there are either serves a function or (as far as thought goes) is irrelevant. On Peirce's account, such qualities are truly ineliminable and, moreover, they are in countless instances cognitively significant (thought fulfills its function by relying on such qualities, i.e., by pressing these qualities into the service of cognition). But countless other qualities operate on their own, quite distinct from the exigencies of thought.

Just as a piece of music may be written in parts, each part having its own air, so various systems of relationship of succession subsist together between the same sensations [or feelings]. These differences are distinguished by different motives, ideas, or functions. (EP 1, 129)

In this light, the human mind is an incredibly complex affair. It is nothing less than an ensemble of "various systems of relationship" (emphasis added). "Thought is," Peirce emphasizes, "only one such system, for its sole motive, idea, and function, is to produce belief" (ibid.). I am inclined to suggest even thought, so conceived, is but one system of thought. Given the diverse ways in which immediate qualities are related to one another, our mental life is hardly exhausted by its cognitive tasks (whether these are conceived narrowly as the sum of processes ordained to producing beliefs or more broadly than this).

In this connection, Champagne aptly marshals and indeed heavily leans on a claim by Peirce concerning the qualisign (a quality functioning as a sign). "A Qualisign is a quality which is a sign" (EP 2, 291). What a quality is, in itself, apart from all else, is distinct from what it is in its role as a sign. But things in general do not cease to be what they are when they function as signs and qualities in particular; however much our relationship to them might be modified when a quality serves as a qualisign, it does not cease to be a quality. A quality in itself could never function as a sign: the embodiment of the quality in a medium is requisite for it to acquire this function. Thus, a quality "cannot act as a sign until it is embodied; but the embodiment has nothing to do with its character as a sign" (EP 2, 291). It of course has everything to do with its actuality as a sign. That it is a sign depends on embodiment; what kind of sign it is, however, depends on the mode of being of whatever is, in a given instance, functioning as a sign. A sinsign is a sign in which a singular or individual object or event fulfills the function of a sign, by being the power of such an object or event to mediate between an object and an interpretant (or, as is true in most instances, a series of interpretants). A legisign is a sign in which something inherently general (e.g., a rule or habit) functions as a sign, by its power of mediation. So, the qualisign is one of three classes of signs, distinguished on the basis of what a sign is, in itself. The more famous classification of signs as icons, indexes, and symbols is based on how a sign is related to its object (roughly speaking, an icon signifies its object by virtue of shared qualities,[6] an index by virtue of a causal relation, and a symbol by virtue of a habitual connection.[7])

Felt qualities serve as more or less reliable signs in myriad contexts and their pervasive role in our mental lives cannot be gainsaid. Peirce coined the word qualisign as a way of identifying qualities serving as signs. In Champagne's judgment, a phenomenological delineation of qualia, conjoined to a semeiotic conception of qualisigns, provides the momentous first steps toward a resolution of the "hard problem."

​Such a drama however cannot be played out without the stage being set. Hence, the author in the opening chapters (especially Chapter 1, "Introduction," and Chapter 2, "Calling on the Helpful Resources of Semiotic Inquiry") takes pains to set the stage. It is surprising not to find, in the References for these chapters,  Joseph Ransdell, James J. Liszka, or T. L. Short among the expositors of Peirce upon whom he draws, especially given the way Short in particular frames his account of Peirce's theory of signs in reference to contemporary debates about human mentality. What T. L. Short and Max H. Fisch help us to see is that Peirce does not offer so much a theory of signs, as a theory of semiosis (sign-activity). As deeply as it cuts against the grain of our habits of thought, signs on this account exert an agency of their own. At the most rudimentary level, we do not endow meaningless sounds or shapes with significance; rather they possess meaning by virtue of a network of relationships, many of which antedate anything instituted by consciousness or mind. A fossil is, for example, significant even if interpreters fail to grasp either its specific import or the mere fact of a decipherable relationship, however it might elude us at present. Champagne does appreciate that mind is to be explained in terms of semiosis rather than sign-activity in terms of mind (see, e.g., p. 4).

​An understanding of semiotics (specifically, Peirce's theory of signs or semiosis) "can remedy much of the current puzzlement about qualia" (p. 1). Champagne goes some distance toward showing how to dispel this puzzlement. His efforts are unlikely to persuade those who take the "hard problem" to be an insoluble problem. They are likely to protest: he discovers under a rock what he himself put there! He can of course respond by appealing to the phenomena of qualia, as they appear and operate in our conscious lives: "the very thing sought is excluded from the start . . . The culprit is not experiential qualities, but the rather disenchanted vision of the world that makes qualities seem out of place" (p. 96). "Ideally, a full account of the conscious mind should cover both qualia and their practical effects" (p. 3). Qualia play a role in guiding our actions, while actions generate occasions in which pervasive and emergent qualities invite our acknowledgment, both for what they are in themselves and what they are in their entanglements with events, exertions, and flights of fancy. ​Signs are both generated and generative.

This is a very suggestive book. It is moreover a clearly and engagingly written text, and (for the most part) a carefully and responsibly argued one. While I am in deep sympathy with both its advocacy of Peirce's semeiotic and Champagne's insistence on the deep-cutting relevance of this theory to debates regarding mind, I suspect those who do not share this sympathy will not find this endeavor successful, nor these arguments persuasive.

At the conclusion of Chapter 1, Champagne quotes Nathan Houser's claim regrading Peirce's theory of signs. It may prove to be Peirce's most important contribution to philosophy (p. 8). But this contribution is not adequately intelligible apart from other parts of his philosophy, above all, his phenomenology as a doctrine of his categories of firstness, secondness, and thirdness. Expositors and defenders of Peirce cannot presume a familiarity with his doctrine of categories any more than with his theory of signs. This gives rise to a dilemma. To show in sufficient detail Peirce's relevance to a contemporary debate requires explaining the intricacies of an approach in some respects far removed from the sensibility of those today who might most benefit from his approach. When done well, introducing Peirce's approach places tremendous demands on contemporary readers who are not familiar with even the basic outline of his architectonic project. To try cutting corners is likely to undermine the very purpose one is striving to achieve.

As an exposition of Peirce in which the salience of his contribution to debates in the philosophy of mind is made not only evident but also convincing, Champagne's book comes up short. The very trichotomy of tone, token, and type, no less than those of icon, index symbol, of qualisign, sinsign, and legisign (to mention only three crucial classifications) needed to be more fully elaborated. To skip over too many details and, above all, the interconnections among these details insures that the case for the power and relevance of Peirce's contribution will be unsuccessful. To go into the depth and detail requisite for a working understanding of Peirce's architectonic project will all too likely do what all too many readers have done, throwing up their hands and pronouncing him "a hopeless crank" (James).[8] Striking the right balance is an extremely difficult task. If Champagne has failed to strike this balance, as so many others of us have also failed to do, this is not in the least a harsh criticism. It is simply an indication of the difficulty of the task. The promise of using Peirce's semeiotic to offer a more convincing account of how to combine phenomenal qualia and cognitive functions is one worth making. In a very suggestive manner, the author has gone some distance toward fulfilling this promise. If a greater distance must yet be traversed, this again is more a sign of the difficulty of the task than the shortcomings of this inquirer. If others in the community of inquirers[9] take up and try to carry forward this task, they will be greatly aided by Champagne's efforts and insights.

[1] "What Is It Like to Be a Bat?" in Philosophical Review, 84, 4 (1974), p. 449.

[2] See, for example, James's Essays on Radical Empirical Empiricism and Dewey's "Qualitative Thought" (1930), "Time and Individuality" (1940), "Peirce's Theory of Quality" (1935), and of course Art as Experience.

[3] See Nathan Houser's "Peirce's General Taxonomy of Consciousness" in The Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, etc.

[4] Where relevant, I will provide references to both The Essential Peirce, volumes 1 and 2 (cited as EP 1 and EP 2) and The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, volumes 1-6, edited by Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss, volumes 7 and 8, edited by Arthur W. Burks (Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1931-1958). The Collected Papers are cited as CP, plus the volume, plus the paragraph number (so, e.g., CP 5.395 refers to paragraph #395 in volume 5 of The Collected Papers. The Essential Peirce, volume 1, edited by Nathan Houser and Christian Kloesel (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1992) and The Essential Peirce, volume 2, edited by the Peirce Edition Project (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1998).

[5] The broader term feeling seems more appropriate here and elsewhere than the narrow one sensation. As Peirce suggests, "whenever we are awake, something is present to the mind and what is present, without reference to any compulsion [or secondness] or reason [i.e., any thirdness of mediation] is feeling" (EP 2, 4; quoted by Champagne, p. 13). Whenever we are conscious, whether awake or dreaming, feelings in this sense are present. He asserts, "nobody really is in a state of feeling, pure and simple" (ibid.), since feelings are inseparably bound up with experiential compulsions and rational (or self-controlled) operations. But we can, by a process which Peirce calls precission or prescissive abstraction (to be distinguished from hypostatic abstraction [see, e.g., Champagne, p. 26], focus on in isolation that which cannot in fact be separated. The qualities with which we are experientially familiar are embodied qualities, but by means of precission we can isolate a quality and consider it, in itself, apart from all else. Even so, just how hard this task proves to be serves to indicate that we never (or hardly ever) are "in a state of feeling, pure and simple."

[6] "a Qualisign is necessarily an Icon" (EP 2, 294).

[7] More than a few expositors of Peirce assert that he defines a symbol in terms of a conventional connection between a sign and its object (e.g., the word dog designates its object on the basis of an historically evolved set of conventions). However, this is inaccurate. There are even occasions when Peirce mispresents himself! But his considered position is that a symbol is based on a habit, but not all habits are instances of convention. This implies that there are natural symbols, signs based on innate rather than culturally acquired habits. For example, the mating rituals of various species of animals are natural symbols. However much iconic and especially indexical facets figure into the functioning of such displays, there is, at bottom, a set of dispositions to act in certain ways, in certain circumstances and these dispositions provide the link between the object and its interpretants.

[8] In a Letter to the British pragmatist J. C. F. Schiller, William James wrote that Peirce "is a hopeless crank and failure in many ways, but a really extraordinary intellect. I never knew a mind of so many different kinds of spotty intensity or vigor." Quoted by Ralph Barton Perry in The Thought and Character of William James, volume 2, (Boston: Little, Brown and Company, 1935), p. 375.

[9] "We individually cannot reasonably hope," Peirce stresses, "the ultimate philosophy we pursue; we can only seek it . . . for the community of philosophers" (EP 1, 29).