Consciousness and the Prospects of Physicalism

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Derk Pereboom, Consciousness and the Prospects of Physicalism, Oxford University Press, 2011, 195pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199764037.

Reviewed by Emmett L. Holman, George Mason University


In recent decades a number of arguments have emerged designed to show that physicalist theories of mind cannot do justice to the nature of consciousness. These arguments have resulted in a huge literature with a dialectic that has led to increasingly interesting and sophisticated positions on both sides of the issue. In particular, some physicalists have lately been exploring new and out-of-the-mainstream ways of answering the anti-physicalist arguments. Derk Pereboom's new book is the latest contribution to this literature, and it is much to be recommended to anyone who wants to keep abreast on these matters. As the title indicates, Pereboom explores the prospects of physicalism, and in particular the prospect that some new and out-of-the-mainstream approach may be able to successfully answer the anti-physicalist arguments.

The book divides into three parts: in each of chapters 1-4 and 5-6 Pereboom considers a possible physicalist response to the anti-physicalist arguments. Both of these responses could be considered out-of-the-mainstream, and the first is (so far as I know) genuinely new with Pereboom. Then, in chapters 7-8 he presents his own version of a non-reductivist physicalist theory. But all this is done in a tentative fashion. The author is not sure that physicalism can be salvaged. But if it can, perhaps one or another of the proposals he makes in this book can do so. That, at any rate, is the spirit in which they are made. In this review, I will summarize all three parts of the book. My comments and criticisms, however, will focus on the first two.

The anti-physicalist arguments all take as their point of departure a first-person or introspective perspective. So, as Pereboom characterizes it, they rest on two key premises: first, that the introspective mode of presentation represents phenomenal properties as having a qualitative nature different from any that a physical mode of presentation represents them as having; and second, that this introspective representation is accurate. Pereboom accepts the first of these, but he thinks it is an 'open possibility' that the second is wrong. So he offers up what he calls the 'qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis': that introspective representation represents phenomenal properties as having qualitative natures they do not have. Chapters 1-4 of the book are devoted to developing this idea and working out its implications.

Pereboom may seem to be proposing that introspective representations are just flat out illusory, but it's a little more complicated than that. So let's ask: What exactly is the content of the introspective representations? If one believes in phenomenal concepts, one could ask what the phenomenal concept that does the referring work from an introspective perspective refers to? One answer is that it refers to a property that has the qualitative nature which, according to the qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis, it doesn't have. In such a case, the introspective representational states are systematically illusory, and we are committed to an eliminativism with respect to phenomenal properties.

But another answer would be that the phenomenal concept refers to a property which appears to have the qualitative nature which, according to the qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis, it doesn't have. On that way of looking at it, the introspective representations are veridical; there really is a property that appears to have the qualitative nature in question. Pereboom maintains that both of these ways of looking it are correct; i.e., he adopts a dualistic account of the content of phenomenal concepts, similar to David Chalmers' position on secondary quality concepts[1]: there is an ideal content, according to which, in order for the content to count as veridical, things have to actually be exactly as represented. On the qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis, this content is illusory. Now this ideal content is so called because it presents an ideal standard, but there is a fallback position from the ideal (actually Pereboom sees a series of possible fallbacks, but I won't go into that) which approximates the ideal closely enough and provides us with an 'ordinary' content that (usually, at least) is veridical. This ordinary content is constituted by the normal cause of the introspective representation.

The point of all this, of course, is to bring the introspective representations in line with physicalism. The qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis, if we can accept it, undermines some of the key premises in the various anti-physicalist arguments, and Pereboom devotes Chapters 1-4 to showing (in some detail) how this is so and discussing some of the recent literature on all this.

It is interesting to compare this strategy with the most popular physicalist strategy for dealing with the anti-physicalist arguments. According to the popular strategy, the introspective mode of presentation employs concepts different from those used in any physical mode of presentation, but concepts that are still co-referential with physical concepts. For this to work, however, these so-called 'phenomenal concepts' cannot be mediated via a property that is only contingently related to the referent, else we could then question the physical status of this new property, and nothing would have been gained -- or so it is argued. Now on Pereboom's approach the introspective representation of the phenomenal property is, in fact, mediated via a contingently related property. But given the qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis, this contingently related property is not instantiated, and physicalism cannot be threatened by properties that are not instantiated. This is a very clever move, but it carries with it problems of its own, as we'll see.

So how convincing is all this? The qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis does, of course, fly in the face of a long tradition according to which introspectively based judgments are infallible, but that is a tradition that doesn't carry the authority it once did anyway. One might wonder if adopting the hypothesis just pushes the question to another level: phenomenal redness (say) may be saved for physicalism, but how about the property: introspectively representing phenomenal redness? But Pereboom maintains that we can just simply apply the inaccuracy hypothesis to it too, and he makes a credible case that this can be done without begging any questions or generating any infinite regresses. But there is a related question for which his answer is less satisfactory.

Consider introspective representations from the perspective of their ideal content. Can such representations be understood in such a way as to be consistent with physicalism? This is an especially crucial question, since ideal content is such that all representations of it are illusory; and the most popular strategy for 'naturalizing' mental representation doesn't allow for this, understanding content as the actually instantiated property that normally (in some sense of 'normally') causes representations with that content. Pereboom acknowledges this problem, but his answer loses me. He points out that the ordinary content of an introspective representation can be naturalized in the standard way, but how this is supposed to solve the problem for the ideal content is never made clear. At one point he does briefly discuss possible models of representation for the introspective mode of presentation, but it is all done in a pretty sketchy way. So even though there is plenty in these opening chapters that is well and thoroughly done and that even (I think one can say without hyperbole) breaks new ground, there are one or two important loose ends that need to be tied up for the case to be fully made.

In chapters 5-6 Pereboom explores another out-of-the-mainstream approach to answering the anti-physicalist arguments: Russellian monism. Russellian monism has gotten a lot of attention for quite a few years now, so it is hardly new with Pereboom. Still, he has some interesting things to say on the subject.

Russellian monism starts off with a view of physical theory (once advocated by Bertrand Russell[2]) according to which it, at least in its present form, provides information about dispositional or extrinsic properties of its subject matter, but not about its categorical or intrinsic properties. Now right away one must pause, because the categorical-dispositional distinction is not, or not obviously, the same as the intrinsic-extrinsic distinction, and some self-styled advocates of Russellian monism focus on one of these distinctions and some on the other, and some seem to gloss over the difference altogether. One virtue of Pereboom's discussion is that he tries to sort all this out and settles on categorical, intrinsic properties and those that are not as the right distinction. So, as he sees it, Russellian monism assumes the following:

(Intrinsicness Principle): Any mind-independently real substantial entity must have at least one substantival ['categorical', I assume] absolutely intrinsic property.

An absolutely intrinsic property is one that is intrinsic and does not reduce to parts having purely extrinsic properties. And a purely extrinsic property is one that is extrinsic and has no intrinsic aspects. (He gives as an example of an extrinsic property that does have intrinsic aspects, being wise. This is extrinsic insofar as it is a comparative property, but one is wise also in virtue of have certain intrinsic attributes)

The idea, then, is that physics, at least in its current form, leaves us ignorant of the absolutely intrinsic, categorical properties of the physical world. Taking this position provides another way of answering the anti-physicalist arguments. This is because all the knowledge physics can tell us about the world does not mean all the knowledge, period. So one can have all such knowledge and be ignorant of the absolutely intrinsic properties that, on the Russellian view, underlie the dispositions and provide the substance (as it were) which constitutes the relata of the extrinsic properties. The way is then left open for a physicalism of sorts.

Here it depends on what the absolutely intrinsic, categorical properties turn out to be. They could be 'phenomenal micro-psychist' -- essentially and irreducibly phenomenal -- in which case we would have panpsychism. Or they could be 'protophenomenal' -- not essentially phenomenal, but such as to provide a supervenience base for the phenomenal (or otherwise ground it in a non-gappy way) -- in which case we would have a form of physicalism. At present we don't know which it is, of course, but that still means that an opening is left for physicalism.

Pereboom's discussion in these chapters includes, among other things, a look at how various historical figures (Leibniz, Newton, Locke, Kant) stood on the reality, nature, and knowability vs. unknowability of absolutely intrinsic properties. He also looks at various arguments currently on offer for and against the Russellian view. He doesn't conclude that Russellian monism (of either variety) is true, but, as with the qualitative inaccuracy hypothesis, he regards it as an open possibility, and hence a possible position for the physicalist to adopt.

I have praised Pereboom for attempting to sort out a distinction that is sometimes ignored. A related issue, of course, is whether or not we can draw an intrinsic-extrinsic distinction in a clear way. Pereboom offers no new insights on this, but he does acknowledge and briefly discuss the rather large literature on this in a lengthy footnote. But there is another distinction he doesn't address: what, exactly, is the difference between phenomenal micro-psychist and protophenomenal properties anyway. No one (so far as I know) claims that the former are conscious in any but the most attenuated sense, as that would entail attributing unattenuated consciousness to the inanimate world. And protophenomenal properties, as well as phenomenal micro-psychist ones, are supposed to ground consciousness in a non-gappy way. So without some significant clarification this threatens to become a distinction without a difference, and thus so too does the distinction between panpsychist and physicalist versions of Russellian monism. Pereboom doesn't say anything about this, but then, neither does almost anyone else. But without some clarification we have only the vaguest idea what we are talking about.

In Chapters 7-8 Pereboom proposes a non-reductive physicalism which comports with the two strategies for defending physicalism just discussed. According to non-reductive physicalism, the mental qua mental exercises causal powers, and these causal powers cannot, at either the type or token level, be identified with the causal powers of the physical base. The idea, then, is to allow that the mental has a kind of causal/explanatory autonomy without giving up on physicalism. This is a tricky business, and there are some well known arguments by Jaegwon Kim that it cannot be pulled off.[3] Kim argues that the causal autonomy can only be purchased at the price of an implausible causal overdetermination, that non-reductionism leads to a kind of emergentism that undermines the physicalist aspirations, that the most popular form of non-reductive physicalism -- namely, functionalism -- leaves us with a weak or vacuous account of mental causal powers, and that the multiple realizability of mental states that motivates and is embraced by non-reductionism means that mental states cannot be scientific kinds.

To answer these objections, Pereboom develops two separate, but complementary, themes. The first is that one can specify a sense of 'constituted by' such that mental tokens are constituted by their physical base. In particular, a token of a mental causal power is constituted by the physical causal power in which it is grounded, rather than being identical with it. This is developed with an eye to answering the causal overdetermination and emergentist objections.

The other theme Pereboom develops is that mental types are intrinsic properties. They are, in particular, physical compositional properties, properties at a higher, or more abstract level, than the neurophysiological or micro-physical. This allows for multiple realizability without going the functionalist route. In fact, he sees his approach as in line with Stephen Yablo's proposal that the relation of mental properties to their physical property base is that of determinable to determinate.[4]

Since this approach is not functionalist, the fact, if it is a fact, that functionalism gives us an impoverished account of mental causation is irrelevant. Pereboom further argues that the multiple realizability of his proposed kind of higher order property need not rule out that the realizers have important features in common. Thus the projectibility needed to make for a scientific kind is not ruled out.

In sum, I see this as a very good book in many ways. Probably, because new proposals are advanced therein, the material in chapters 1-4 and 7-8 is the most noteworthy. But it is good throughout. There are places where, I have noted, certain important questions are not addressed that one would like to see addressed, or are done so only sketchily. That is a weakness, but not one serious enough to detract from the book's many virtues.

[1] David Chalmers: "Perception and the Fall from Eden", in Tamar Szabo and John Hawthorne (ed.), Perceptual Experience, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.

[2] Bertrand Russell, The Analysis of Matter, London: Kegan Paul, 1927.

[3] Jaegwon Kim, "Multiple Realizability and the Metaphysics of Reduction", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52 (1992), pp. 1-26; and "Making Sense of Emergence", Philosophical Studies 95 (1999), pp. 3-36.

[4] Stephen Yablo, "Mental Causation", The Philosophical Review 101 (1992), pp. 245-280.