Consciousness: Essays from a Higher-Order Perspective

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Peter Carruthers, Consciousness: Essays from a Higher-Order Perspective, Oxford University Press, 2005, 264pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199277362.

Reviewed by JeeLoo Liu, California State University, Fullerton


Peter Carruthers' latest book on consciousness is a collection of essays; all but two had been previously published (within the past decade). The book consists of twelve chapters, while the content can be divided into three major themes. Chapters 2-6 delineate and defend Carruthers' own theory of consciousness, which he categorizes as a dispositional higher-order thought [HOT] theory. He argues that this theory can bridge the notorious explanatory gap. Chapters 7-8 examine the connection between language and conscious thinking, and argue that language is constitutive of our thought. Finally, chapters 9-12 venture into the world of non-human animals to discuss, while these animals do not have phenomenal consciousness, what kind of mentality we can attribute to them and what our moral attitude toward them should be. The book is written in a clear and rigorous manner, but at times it can be a bit too technical to follow. It is not a book for beginners, but it is worth reading for anyone who wishes to understand current philosophical debates on the nature of consciousness; in particular, to see Caruthers' own theory laid out on the map of theories of consciousness.

Dispositional HOT Theory

A preliminary clarification of Carruthers' theory of consciousness is that his subject matter is conscious mental states; in particular, phenomenal conscious states. As Carruthers defines it, "[m]ental states are phenomenally conscious when it is like something to undergo them, when they have a distinctive subjective aspect, or when they have feel" (p. 3). It is this kind of consciousness, rather than access consciousness, that is regarded by those like David Chalmers as posing the "hard problem." It is this kind of consciousness that is regarded by folks like Joseph Levine as producing an "explanatory gap" in our theories of consciousness. It is also this kind of consciousness that is conceded by everyone (even by a staunch reductionist such as Jaegwon Kim) to be non-reducible to physicalistic properties or explanations. Now Carruthers tells us: not to worry. The hard problem "isn't really so very hard after all" (p. 60). We could solve the problem of phenomenal consciousness; we could reduce phenomenal consciousness to naturalistic properties, and we can explain phenomenal consciousness in functional/intentional terms.

Carruthers' starting point is functionalism. The choice between functionalism and some form of identity theory inclines philosophers to place more confidence either in cognitive sciences or in neurosciences. Under the functionalist view of consciousness, phenomenal consciousness is not necessarily a biological phenomenon. Phenomenal consciousness can be explained, not by identifying its physical correlates in the brain, but by locating its causal/functional roles. A reductive explanation of phenomenal consciousness could be given, according to Carruthers, if we first construe phenomenally conscious properties in terms of a "third-personal characterization." This third-personal characterization renders the concept of phenomenal consciousness relational and non-intrinsic, specifiable in terms of a functional/causal role in the agent's introspection, reasoning, and possibly action schemata. Carruthers calls mental phenomena picked out by the third-personal characterization "the thickly individuated facts," and those picked out by the first-personal recognition "the thinly individuated facts" (pp. 30 ff.). He argues that reductive explanation should target the former, not the latter; furthermore, a reductive explanation can be successfully given for phenomenal consciousness characterized third-personally. Hence, the explanatory gap could be closed as long as we choose our explanandum correctly.

The functional role of phenomenal consciousness, as Carruthers sees it, is to provide some sort of intentional content that would be "available to a faculty of higher-order thought (HOT)" (p. 8). The "higher-order thought" here refers to the agent's cognitive, conceptual, or perceptual representation of his or her own mental states. Carruthers thinks that it is this higher-order thought that gives the agent's mental states a subjective feel. By having a higher-order representation of one's mental state, one is not only experiencing "what the world is like," but also what one's "experience of the world is like" (p. 43). This demand on a higher-order representation separates all higher-order theories from the first-order representational (FOR) theories advocated, in particular, by Fred Dretske and Michael Tye. In Carruthers' construction of our cognitive architecture, we have a judgment of, say, this redness, accompanied by our judgment of this experience of red. The former is a judgment about worldly redness, while the latter is about our own experiences. Many creatures can have the first kind of judgment; only we (and possibly other intelligent primates) can have the second kind of judgment. According to Carruthers, it is this second kind of judgment that gives our phenomenally conscious states a subjective feel. Through this HOT, "conscious experiences don't just present the world (or our own bodies) to us, but also somehow present themselves to us" (p. 137).

By "being available," Carruthers does not mean that the higher-order thought must be "actually" occurrent. The "availability" condition means that the intentional content is either actually targeted by a higher-order thought at the time, or would have been so targeted if, for example, the agent had been paying the right sorts of attention. This condition distinguishes his theory from the actualist HOT theory, which he attributes to David Rosenthal. The difference between the dispositional theory and the actualist theory can be seen in Armstrong's example of the absent-minded truck driver, who would not be phenomenally conscious under the actualist theory, but could be P-conscious under the dispositional theory. Carruthers argues that the actualist theory will face the problem of cognitive overload (p. 54), because at any given moment, we would be receiving an immense amount of perceptual inputs, and it is hard to believe that we could be representing all of them on a higher-order cognitive level. On the dispositional theory, on the other hand, the intentional representations are stored in short-term memory such that they are poised, available for use. Even in the absence of a single (actual) HOT, the subject can be phenomenally conscious of the content of her mental state "provided that the subject remains capable of entertaining HOTs about any aspect of its contents" (p. 55).

Carruthers thinks that our higher-order representations of our own mental states are primarily operative in a cognitive mode, not generated by some sort of inner sense. He argues that "the representations in question would need to be able to ground judgments of appearance, or of seeming, helping the organism to negotiate the distinction between appearance and reality" (p. 51). This specification of cognitive representation of one's own mental states is what distinguishes HOT theories from other forms of higher-order theories, in particular, William Lycan's higher-order experience (HOE) theory.

In summary, for Carruthers our phenomenally conscious states have two contents: the lower-order representation of the world or of our body and the higher-order representation of our experience of the world or of our body. These experiences "become both world-representing (e.g., with the analog content red) and experience-representing (e.g., with the analog content seems red or experience of red) at the same time" (p. 107). It is one and the same set of states that have both these contents; for this reason, Carruthers also calls his theory the dual-content theory (p. 64).

Thought and Language

"Phenomenal consciousness" applies to our perceptual states. When it comes to conscious thinking which does not have the phenomenal feel, Carruthers posits a mental faculty, which he calls a "mind-reading" faculty. He argues that "conscious thinking requires immediate, non-inferential, non-interpretative access to our own occurrent thoughts" (p. 117). As with first-order perceptual states, here it is also the higher-order thought that makes the first-order thought conscious. Carruthers says, "a conscious thought will be one that is available to thoughts about the occurrence of that thought" (p. 123). Examples of higher-order awareness of one's own thought are "I am currently thinking that P" or "I am currently desiring that Q," etc.

Carruthers adopts what he calls the cognitive conception of language. Under this conception, language is constitutive of (some forms of) thought because we conduct our conscious propositional thinking in natural language. If our inner speech were not the same as the natural language we use, then we would need interpretation of our own thought. In that case, our higher-order access to our occurrent thought would not be immediate and non-inferential, and our occurrent thought would therefore be unconscious. Hence, continues Carruthers' argument, if we want to acknowledge that we do employ conscious propositional thinking, then our inner speech must consist in our natural language.

Animal Consciousness and Animal Mentality

If what defines 'phenomenal consciousness' is a higher-order thought, then non-linguistic animals do not have phenomenal consciousness. As Carruthers claims, "I conclude that higher-order representation theories will entail … that very few animals besides ourselves are subject to phenomenally conscious mental states" (p. 51). Does this imply that these animals are not sentient, not minded, unaware of suffering and do not deserve our sympathy? Of course not, Carruthers argues.

In Chapters 9 to 10, Carruthers makes the following claims: (1) Even if non-human animals are not conscious of their experiences, they can still suffer from other forms of mental harm such as disappointment, frustration or thwarted desire, and thus can still deserve our sympathy. (2) Even though phenomenal consciousness requires higher-order thought, non-conscious creatures can and do suffer on the first-order level. They can perceive pain and find it to be awful, for example, even though they do not perceive their own perception of the pain. As Carruthers puts it, "So there seems nothing to prevent animals from finding their pains awful, even if their pain experiences aren't phenomenally conscious ones" (p. 186).

In Chapters 11 and 12, Carruthers argues that non-human animals' lacking phenomenal consciousness does not matter in their cognitive architecture, since they do have a mind as well as many mental functions that we possess. In the two figures (11.1 and 11.2) on pages 201-2, one depicting a mind with a dual-visual system and lacking a HOT faculty while the other depicts the mind with a HOT faculty, the two functional flows are basically the same, with the exception of the latter's having an extra box for the HOT faculty. The extra function does not seem to play any significant role in the core architecture of the mind, not to mention in the initiation of action. As a result, it matters little in our explanation of the action/behavior of non-human animals that they do not have phenomenal consciousness. Carruthers concludes that his theory and its implications on animals will have very little significance for comparative psychology.

Carruthers is attempting an ambitious project by locating the elusive phenomenal consciousness in the causal/representational architecture of the mind. However, his characterization of phenomenal consciousness seems to waver between two conceptions: one is to render it functional and playing a certain causal role; the other is to render it almost epiphenomenal and explanatorily irrelevant. Under the first characterization, phenomenal consciousness is given a functional/causal role by virtue of its intentional content. The higher-order thought represents the lower-order perceptual states stored in short-term memory to the agent, and the agent thereby has a phenomenally conscious state. In this respect, Carruthers's phenomenal consciousness is very closely related to access consciousness. Carruthers is committed to the (logical) possibility that there might be phenomenally conscious events that "aren't access conscious (that aren't available for reporting in speech or to figure in decision-making)" (p. 77). However, he does not think such a possibility is real, because "within our experience and to the best of our belief these two properties are always co-instantiated" (ibid.). When standing alone, phenomenal consciousness does not seem to enter into the causation of action, nor is it usually relevant to our explanation of behavior. One cannot help wondering: what is the cognitive function of phenomenal consciousness after all? As Carruthers acknowledges, "The fact that those perceptual states also happen to be phenomenally conscious ones in the case of humans will be irrelevant to the explanation" (p. 202). The only situation where phenomenal consciousness is explanatorily relevant is when we try to explain how we humans "draw a distinction between the way things are and the way they seem or appear" and our actions depend on such distinctions (p. 204). This implies that unless we are in a skeptical mode or we are scrupulously self-reflective, our phenomenal consciousness is epiphenomenal. In that case, why don't we utilize Occam's Razor on this theoretical posit of phenomenal consciousness?

Carruthers takes it to be an advantage of his theory that the so-called qualia, those intrinsic, non-relational, ineffable, private qualities of experience are explained away. In their stead, however, he introduces purely recognitional concepts. A concept is purely recognitional, as Carruthers defines it, "when nothing in the grasp of that concept, as such, requires its user to apply or appeal to any other concept or belief" (p. 83). In other words, the subject has a direct acquaintance with, or an indexical reference to, what is captured by the concept. According to Carruthers, there are two levels of purely recognitional concepts -- one recognizing features of the world (e.g., this red) while the other recognizing our experiences of these features (this experience of red). Both kinds of concepts "will have no conceptual connections with any of our physical, causal-role, or intentional-content concepts -- not even with the concept experience, if this is functionally specified by the characteristic place of experiences in the causal architecture of cognition" (p. 81).

Carruthers argues, "from the fact that we have concepts of phenomenally conscious states that lack any conceptual connections with physical, functional, or intentional concepts, it of course doesn't follow that the properties that our purely recognitional concepts pick out aren't physical, functional, or intentional ones" (p. 68). However, "concepts" and "properties" cannot be so readily separated. The "this" in our concepts picks out the properties we experience but could not express, nor communicate, in any other way (hence, ineffable and private). Therefore, purely recognitional concepts designate first-person experiential properties, which defy reductive explanation. The explanatory gap is not closed; it is simply pushed to a different corner. In the end, even if we can have a reductive explanation for higher-order thought, we do not have any reductive explanation for purely recognitional concepts or the properties they "recognize." There is still a huge explanatory gap between a functionalistic characterization of consciousness and purely recognitional concepts.

Carruthers demonstrates his mastery of knowledge not only of philosophical theories of consciousness, but also of experimental psychology, animal psychology, and cognitive sciences. However, owing to the nature of collected essays, the chapters in this book occasionally repeat the same data or same explanations. Tighter editing could have made this book more concise. Another problem with the book is that Carruthers made constant reference (pp. 9 ff., 56 ff., 64, 76, 93 ff., 106, 110, 136, 144, 201) to the importance of "consumer semantics" to his whole project (he claims that his theory assumes the truth of "some or other form of consumer semantics"), but never gave the theory any clear explanation. Nor did he defend the truth of consumer semantics anywhere in the book, even though he claims that the "acceptance of some or other form of consumer semantics" is one of the necessary ingredients of his own theory (p. 136). The book would have been more complete if it also contained a well-developed chapter on "consumer semantics," as well as a more conclusive explication of the connection between language and thought.